Art and Aesthetics After Adorno

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Jay M. Bernstein, Claudia Brodsky, Anthony J. Cascardi, Thierry de Duve, Aleš Erjavec, Robert Kaufman, and Fred Rush, Art and Aesthetics After Adorno, University of California Press, 2010, 299pp., $18.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780982329429.

Reviewed by Gerald Bruns, University of Notre Dame


The title of this volume of papers recalls a famous essay by the conceptual artist Joseph Kosuth, "Art After Philosophy" (1969), in which Kosuth cheerfully turned Hegel on his head: "The twentieth century," he wrote, "brought in a time which could be called 'the end of philosophy and the beginning of art.'"[1] By this he meant that the modernist artwork is no longer answerable to any concept except the one peculiar to itself, as in the case of a Marcel Duchamp "Readymade" (a urinal, a snow shovel), which entails the assertion, "This is a definition of art." The definition is appropriately self-defeating. The modernist work is absolutely singular, outside the alternatives of universal and particular: an anomaly or heteroclite that alters (and is altered by) whatever context it invades. It is not an instance of any form or experience -- certainly not an aesthetic experience in any received sense of the word, perhaps not even an experience of an object. In 1968, for example, Lawrence Weiner "decided to have his work exist only as a proposal in his notebook … ; it didn't matter whether it was made or not" (Conceptual Art, p. 173). About this same time the British conceptualists Terry Atkinson and Michael Baldwin "exhibited" works like "Air Show," which consisted simply of "'a column of air comprising a base of one square mile and of unspecified distance in the vertical dimension'" (Conceptual Art, p. 174).[2] As Sol Lewitt said in "Paragraphs on Conceptual Art" (1964), "Conceptual art is meant to engage the mind of the viewer rather than his eye or emotions" (Conceptual Art, p. 15). Aesthetic experience is as much an experience of an artist's thinking as it is of a piece of work.

One of the motives of conceptual art, as of much of the art constructed while Adorno was composing his Aesthetic Theory, was to free the artwork, not just from its own history, but from the conventions of aesthetics and art criticism, with their inveterate allegiance to concepts of form and value -- "what irreducibly constitutes good art as such," in Clement Greenberg's words.[3] The artworlds of the 1960s may have been beneath Adorno's contempt (and not Adorno's only), but no one understood so well as he their terms of engagement:

The better an artwork is understood … , the more obscure its constitutive enigmaticalness [konstitutiv Rätselhaftes] becomes… . If a work opens itself completely, it reveals itself as a question and demands reflection; then the work vanishes into the distance, only to return to those who thought they understood it, overwhelming them for a second time with the question, 'What is it?'[4]

Similarly, he was dismissive of the very idea of the artist as thinker, but he understood that what artists have to say about their work cannot be brushed off with a superior gesture (Aesthetic Theory, pp. 334-35, and also pp. 24-25, on the importance of "isms"). Arguably the most useful volume of aesthetic theory that we have is Art in Theory, 1900-1990: An Anthology of Changing Ideas, which is composed largely of writings by artists themselves.[5]

Meanwhile, the volume at hand consists of essays by philosophers and critics who, by and large, have had enough of Adorno. The gist of Anthony Cascardi's essay, "Prolegomena to Any Future Aesthetics," is that, after Adorno, aesthetics needs to go back to Aristotle, or at least to Merleau-Ponty: "What is at issue is art's desire to serve as a form of sensuous cognition. This is something that aesthetic theory ought to be able to explain" (p. 16). Adorno's aesthetic theory certainly does not try to explain it. His conception of knowledge is dialectical rather than phenomenological:

Art's so-called intuitability [Anschaulichkeit] is an aporetic construction… . The word Anschaulichkeit, itself borrowed from the theory of discursive knowledge, where it stipulates a formed content, testifies to the rational element in art as much as it conceals that element by dividing off the phenomenal element and hypostatizing it (Aesthetic Theory, pp. 96-97).

Unfortunately Cascardi doesn't engage Adorno on the question of art's cognitive dimension, with its indictment of "the violent act of rationality":

All aesthetic categories must be defined both in terms of their relation to the world and in terms of art's repudiation of that world. In both, art is knowledge, not only as a result of the mundane world and its categories, which is art's bond to what is normally called an object of knowledge, but perhaps even more importantly as a result of the implicit critique of the nature-dominating ratio (Aesthetic Theory, pp. 138-39).

So when Cascardi affirms art as "a sensuously intelligent way of grasping the world" (p. 35), one can imagine Adorno replying that the very idea of "grasping," whether sensuous or otherwise, is just what the artwork calls into question by being itself refractory to any rule of identity. Recall the etymology of Begriff.

In "Adorno After Adorno," Fred Rush notes that "Adorno does discuss the sensuous aspects of art and considers them, at times, to be centrally involved in aesthetic experience proper. But sensuality [sic] is not a necessary condition of such experience, and it is usually not a sufficient one either" (p. 56). Rather, aesthetic experience is "formal experience" (p. 56), where form is no longer classical or even romantic (organic) in character but is decidedly modernist in its rejection of "rational construction" or the assembly of parts into a whole. Not that art can do without these things, but it is no longer defined by them. As Adorno says:

What is heterogeneous in artworks is immanent to them: It is that in them that opposes unity and yet it is needed by unity if it is to be more than a pyrrhic victory over the unresisting. That the spirit of artworks is not to be equated with their immanent nexus -- the arrangement of their sensuous elements -- is evident in that they in no way constitute that gapless unity, that type of form to which aesthetic reflection has falsely reduced them (Aesthetic Theory, p. 89).

Aesthetics, as Rush suggests, must confront the fragmentary, which is the distinctive feature not only of the modernist artwork but of the entire field of art itself:

This is to say that criticism after Adorno will have to be multivalent. Art is not one thing. Not only are there several arts -- music, literature, painting, architecture, and dance -- each of which diverges greatly from others, there are also within the several arts a great degree of plurality (pp. 61-62).

Which is as much as to say that henceforth aesthetics must be historical as well as theoretical in its orientation. Adorno writes: "Art is historical exclusively by way of individual works that have taken shape in themselves, not by their external association, not even through the influence that they purportedly exert over each other. This is why art mocks verbal definition" (Aesthetic Theory, p. 176). Indeed, the irony of Adorno's Aesthetic Theory is that it negates itself dialectically by refusing to engage individual artworks at all: "the medium of theory is abstract, and this is not to be masked by the use of illustrative examples" (Aesthetic Theory, p. 263). One could take Aesthetic Theory, with its poverty of examples, as a terminal case of aesthetics.

In "Framing the Sensuous: Objecthood and 'Objectivity' in Art After Adorno," Claudia Brodsky puts the crucial question squarely: "What is an art object in Adorno?" (p. 73) By way of an answer Brodsky emphasizes the temporality of the artwork:

That an art 'object' can be made of, can contain, 'moments,' and that such 'moments' rather than any specific content are what compose its 'objectivity,' like that of 'truth,' must render such an 'object' nonobjectifiable in the very manner Hegel rejected as nonaesthetic, that of an 'object' that is always changing, and thus not 'properly' an object at all (pp. 80-81).

Accordingly Brodsky devotes some excellent pages to Schoenberg's later fragmentary work as well as to the paratactic constructions of the artist Robert Rauschenberg:

Rauschenberg's art objects -- from the juxtaposition of the compositionally stunning Combines, to the unfinished ¼ Mile or 2 Furlong Piece, which, started in 1981 and projected, at 189 contiguous panels, to be the longest art object in the world, has been exhibited only at states of its development -- expands Adorno's definition considerably: all art in Rauschenberg is merely a fragment of possible art (p. 100).

In much this same spirit, Aleš Erjavec argues in his essay that the whole point of a Duchamp Readymade, or of the avant-garde more generally, is to provoke disagreements as to what counts as art by inventing "borderline cases" or limit-experiences:

Art's characteristics change incessantly, and much of the issue of art remains the question of whether a certain work is a work of art at all. It is because of this uncertainty that [as Adorno says] 'Art can be understood only by its laws of movement, not according to any set of invariants' (p. 194).

Here one is reminded of Arthur Danto's essay, "The Artworld" (1964), with its thesis that in order to see Andy Warhol's Brillo Box as art, "one must have mastered a good deal of artistic theory as well as a considerable amount of the history of recent New York painting."[6] There is no engaging the artwork except at ground level, because what counts as art is local and contingent. Perhaps what we need, after Adorno, is a theory of nomad aesthetics, or a variable way of thinking about art that (like art itself) can pull up stakes as the ground shifts or the weather changes.

Just so, Jay M. Bernstein's contribution, "'The Demand for Ugliness': Picasso's Bodies," is as much art history as it is aesthetic theory. At Adorno's level, modernist art begins by defying "the prohibition of the ugly," that is, "the interdiction of whatever is not formed hic et nunc, of the incompletely formed, the raw. Dissonance is the technical term for the reception through art of what aesthetics as well as naïveté calls ugly" (Aesthetic Theory, pp. 45-46). Bernstein locates this turn more precisely: "Arguably … modernist painting arrived at its exemplary realization in 1907 with Picasso's Les Demoiselles d'Avignon" (p. 211). What makes this work a watershed is that the Demoiselles "appeared aggressive, fragmented, ugly" (p. 214). Les Demoiselles d'Avignon is sometimes cited as one of the first works of Cubism, but Bernstein distinguishes sharply between the "ugly, materialist Picasso" of the Demoiselles and "the beautiful, idealist Picasso" of angles and squares:

There are two irreducible transcendental schemas for the representation of space -- geometry and the human body; since the representation of space is a necessary condition for the representation of the world in general, then geometry and the human body are, in the setting of modern painting, competing transcendental frameworks for making perceptual experience of the world possible (p. 217).

The trouble with "transcendental frameworks," of course, is that they evaporate before they hit the ground. After all, it seems a short step, if not a straight line, from Les Demoiselles d'Avignon to The Girl with a Guitar (1910), which is no doubt more angular and abstract than the Demoiselles but is still formed by a human body, one in which the alternatives of beautiful and ugly seem outside the frame. Nevertheless, one can take Bernstein's point. Picasso in the Demoiselles "deploys what is best thought of as the painterly equivalent of parataxis in order to accomplish [a] systematic disordering … into a new conception of pictorial order" (p. 226) -- one that "ends the rule of subordination" (p. 228), or the resolution of disparate materials into a whole. Adorno associated Cubism with montage, whose "negation of synthesis becomes a principle of form" (Aesthetic Theory, p. 155), but for Bernstein Cubism is a form of "rational construction" that Picasso put behind him, most famously in his Guernica (1937), with its distorted and dismembered bodies. Interestingly, the suffering creatures in Guernica are animals as well as humans. However, given the transcendental premium that Bernstein places on the human body, this might be a distinction without a difference. The resemblance of anything to a human body humanizes it, so that even Picasso's Nude Standing by the Sea -- "this monster … made out of geometric solids" (p. 242) -- is no longer geometrically beautiful but, like the rest of us, humanly ugly. Bernstein's position recalls Stanley Cavell's claim "that the answer to the question 'What is art?' [is] in part an answer which explains why it is we treat certain objects, or how we can treat certain objects, in ways normally reserved for treating persons."[7]

In which case the question of what counts as art is, as Adorno thought, irreducible to criteria, but for reasons different from Adorno's, which is roughly the point of Thierry de Duve's essay, "Resisting Adorno, Revamping Kant," where a judgment of taste as to whether something is beautiful is reformulated as a judgment as to whether something (a Duchamp Readymade, for example) can be called a work of art. De Duve basically reprises the argument of his book, Kant After Duchamp, where "the sentence 'This is art' is the paradigmatic formula of a modern aesthetic judgment in the truest Kantian sense" (p. 265).[8] Adorno and his dialectical nonsense are tossed aside -- "when all is said and done I must confess that Adorno doesn't do much for me; he rarely helps me think" (p. 261) -- in favor of a discussion of

Kant's unique discovery, indeed his unsurpassable contribution to aesthetics, [which] is to have understood that, by making positive judgments about beauty, human beings suppose their humanity to reside in their claimed common ability to have feelings in common. Call it universal empathy, if you want. The pleasure beauty yields [or, for all of that, the modernist pleasure offered by dissonant or ugly artworks] is not the egoistic pleasure of the senses, it must be the joy one has in sharing one's pleasure with anyone and everyone. Schiller's Ode to Joy, put to music by Beethoven in his ninth symphony, exactly transcribes Kant's exhilarating discovery of the sensus communis" (p. 270).

Stanley Cavell, reading Kant through Wittgenstein's eyes, made roughly this point in "Aesthetic Problems of Modern Philosophy" (1965):

It is essential to making an aesthetic judgment that at some point we be prepared to say in its support: don't you see, don't you hear, don't you dig? Because if you do not see something, without explanation, then there is nothing further to discuss… . Reasons -- at definite points, for definite reasons, in different circumstances -- come to an end (Must We Mean What We Say?, p. 93).

But then, as we have seen, disagreements as to what constitutes an artwork are not fruitless but, on the contrary, are one of the conditions of aesthetic experience. Certainly such disagreements are part of what occupies art history, if not aesthetic theory.

Perhaps one could go further and say that when an artwork stops being the occasion of disagreement, it ceases to be an artwork. As Adorno suggests, nothing is more deadly than immortality (Aesthetic Theory, pp. 228-29). Even Duchamp knew that he needed to cut down on his Readymades: even two might be one too many, especially since the thing itself, as Brodsky would say, is more event than object. Indeed, Adorno sometimes makes perishability a requisite of artworks:

Although permanence cannot be excluded from the concept of their form, it is not their essence. Daringly exposed works that seem to be rushing toward their perdition have in general a better chance of survival than those that, subservient to the idol of security, hollow out their temporal nucleus and, inwardly vacuous, fall victim to time: the curse of neoclassicism (Aesthetic Theory, 177).

Adorno then offers a rare mention of what he takes to be an exemplary case:

Stockhausen's concept of electronic works -- which, since they are not notated in the traditional sense but [are] immediately realized in their material, could be extinguished along with this material -- is a splendid one of an art that makes emphatic claim yet is prepared to throw itself away (Aesthetic Theory, pp. 177-178).

Art and aesthetics after Adorno? One thing that remains open to inquiry, as Johanna Drucker has suggested, is "art's dialogue with technology," especially now when electronic media make possible digital artworks whose "sensuous materials" change shape as one moves through them, as in the works of Eduardo Kac, which seem admirably to capture the aesthetic fluidity that Brodsky has emphasized.[9] Drucker writes:

Adorno placed considerable weight on formal strategies of artistic production as a means [of resisting a culture of instrumental reason]. These can be identified by the terms determinate irreconcilability, dissonance, and nonidentity. Are these concepts sustainable within the context of the digital production of works of art? (Speclab, p. 191)

Possibly, if art holds to its utopian task of "[making] things in ignorance of what they are."[10] Whether this task makes sense in the world of digital art is a question that would be worth pursuing, especially since digital art, as Drucker understands it, is a form of conceptual art, in which case one has to decide "whether the essence of the digital work is in fact its file, encoded and encrypted and clearly mathematical, or in a fulfilled, material expression of that file" (Speclab, p. 194). Can an algorithm count as a work of art? Here the task of any future aesthetics might be not to put Adorno aside but to see where engagement with him in new contexts might lead.

No doubt he will lead, as usual, to disagreements. Adorno declared himself against "vacuous schemata of works [that] take the place of the works themselves" (Aesthetic Theory, p. 296), and he sided with Pierre Boulez against "avant-garde artists who believe that annotated instructions for the employment of technical procedures already amount to an artwork" (Aesthetic Theory, p. 342). Yet he famously conferred aesthetic autonomy on musical scores: they "are not only almost always better than the performances, they are more than simply instructions for them; they are indeed the thing itself" (Aesthetic Theory, p. 100).

So here's a question for our once and future aesthetic theory: What's the difference between an algorithm and a musical score?

[1] Conceptual Art: A Critical Anthology, ed. Alexander Alberro and Blake Stimson (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1999), p. 160.

[2] This year, incidentally, is the fiftieth anniversary of the publication of Silence: Lectures and Writings by John Cage (Middletown, CT: Wesleyan University Press, 1961), with its declaration that "sound, at last, has come into its own," meaning that "noises are as useful to new music as so-called musical tones, for the simple reason that they are sounds. This decision alters the view of history, so that one is no longer concerned with tonality or atonality, Schoenberg or Stravinsky (the twelve tones or the twelve expressed as seven plus five), nor with consonance and dissonance, but rather with Edgard Varèse who fathered forth noise into twentieth-century music" (pp. 68-69). The citation is from "The History of Experimental Music in the United States" (1959). Varèse (1883-1965) is sometimes called the "father of electronic music." OHM: The Early Gurus of Electronic Music: 1948-1950, a 3-cd collection published by The Electronic Music Foundation, contains Varèse's "Poem Électronique" (1958), as well as works by some forty other composers, including Cage's "Williams Mix."

[3] "After Abstract Expressionism," Art International, 6, no. 8 (1962), 26.

[4] Aesthetic Theory, trans. Robert Hullot-Kentor (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1997), p. 121.

[5] Ed. Charles Harrison and Paul Wood (Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1992). Art in Theory runs to nearly 600 pages. See also Theories and Documents of Contemporary Art: A Sourcebook of Artists' Writings, ed. Kristine Stiles and Peter Selz (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1996), which assembles material roughly contemporary with the writing of Aesthetic Theory (and which runs to nearly a thousand pages).

[6] The Journal of Philosophy, 61, no. 19 (October 1964), 581.

[7] See Cavell, "Music Discomposed" (1967), Must We Mean What We Say? (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1969), p. 189; see also pp. 197-98.

[8] Kant After Duchamp (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1998), esp. pp. 301-25.

[9] See Johanna Drucker, SPECLAB: Digital Aesthetics and Projects in Speculative Computing (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2009), p. 191. See Eduardo Kac's website,, and also his edition of Media Poetry: An International Anthology (Chicago: Intellect, 2007).

[10] "Vers une musique informelle" (1961), Quasi una Fantasia: Essays on Modern Music, trans. Rodney Livingstone (London: Verso Press, 1998), p. 322.