Art and Morality: Essays in the Spirit of George Santayana

Placeholder book cover

Morris Grossman, Art and Morality: Essays in the Spirit of George Santayana, Martin A. Coleman (ed.), Fordham University Press, 2014, 315pp., $26.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823257232.

Reviewed by Matthew Caleb Flamm, Rockford University


In a climate where print academic publications are increasingly financially unfeasible it is encouraging to see presses like Fordham University's backing a rich, eclectic collection like this one by Morris Grossman. Grossman died in 2012, and the book honors his scholarly career. As a brief preface by the editor Martin A. Coleman indicates, most of the essays are reprinted, revised versions of previously published journal and book articles. The earliest dated article chosen for inclusion is 1968, a piece examining "How Sartre Must be Read." Most of the remaining selections are dated as having appeared in the seventies and eighties, a few in the nineties, one in 2005 and two non-dated pieces (presumably written for the volume).

Career-crowning collections can be forced or failing of their purpose, appearing to readers more as a motley assortment of pieces with little to no binding thematic connection. Thankfully this collection is not one of those. It is put together with care and what appears to be an obviously engaged presence of the author throughout the process of preparing the various included pieces.

While the collection is unsuitable for introductory students of aesthetics, art, and philosophy, upper level students in those identified subject areas could definitely profit from its reading. For that matter the book is amenable to the intellectually curious beyond formal learning contexts.

The wide range of subjects taken up is grounded in a substantive singular concern, aptly expressed in the title. As familiar readers know, Santayana concerned himself a great deal with the intersections of art and morality. Following suit, Grossman articulates his version of this concern in the introduction, identifying his intent to examine the "rival claims of art and morality." (15)

The exact meaning of "rival" in this characterization is important and makes a difference for how readers are to understand Grossman's various considerations. Regarding the advertised conflict between morality and art, Grossman offers that he is a "contrarian" (15) who favors "maintaining tensions" (57) between the two. As I note in this review, there are questionable moments in Grossman's contrarian approach to this interesting thematic concern, moments thankfully redeemed by his continual artist's resolve (Grossman was a musician as well as philosopher) to emulate "the ultimate poet who cannot actually exist." (261)

The book has twenty-four chapters, which are divided into three parts: I. "Art and Morality" (chapters 1-8); II. "Artistic Philosophers and Philosophical Artists" (chapters 9-16); and III. "Santayana" (17-24). Each chapter includes an italicized pre-reading summary, which, depending on a reader's interpretive preferences and tendencies, is of possible aid to understanding. These preambles  attempt to express in compressed form the main claims of the essay, a challenging task given Grossman's writing style, which is conversational and subverting of the analytical-polemics of mainstream philosophic scholarship. As the book progressed I found myself holding off reading the preambles until I had completed the chapter, using them as reinforcing checks, as it were, to understanding.

Grossman's writing perspective is speculatively friendly, above the fray and sensitive to lines of critical dispute, preferring to multiply rather than to resolve questions. He opens the first chapter with a barrage of questions about the "relationship between art and life" (there are ten question marks in the first six paragraphs of the chapter). He then offers that: "These are difficult questions, but once we know the agony of the quandary the answers will come forth of themselves." (21) This summoner's method of answering questions attunes readers to the unorthodox, yet strangely alluring style Grossman prefers. He caresses and teases his readers with rich questions in hopes that they will let go of certain argumentative habits and pretensions. This method is perhaps apropos of Grossman, "aesthetician and musician" that he was.

A general virtue of Grossman's various writings -- and this appears to have been consistent throughout his publishing career -- is that he avoids esoteric jargon and other obscurantist tendencies from which works in aesthetics and the philosophy of music can sometimes suffer. Sophisticated and thoughtful in his presentation, he makes his points with humble curiosity and openness, avoiding the proverbial pretensions of artists talking about art.

Though for the most part Grossman presents his themes with a general philosophic audience in mind, his analyses of the aesthetics of music in the third through fifth chapters come closest to distancing him from that audience. Portions of the chapters beg not only an interest in, but also ideally some literacy in, music theory, classical music, and especially Beethoven, Bach, and Mozart. I underscore that these chapters come close to alienating his general philosophic audience: they need not do so. Grossman is foremost an aesthetician, and even as he considers technical musical notions like modulation and key shift, tonality, and notation, the discussion remains philosophically interesting enough to invite mutual understanding from even the most tone deaf.

Speaking of tempo in musical composition, Grossman writes in "Performance and Obligation": "There are recorded performances of a Bach work, by Toscanini and Casals, in which the ratio of the respective pacing is two to one." (73) A reader without frame of reference for any of these characterizations can still connect with Grossman's general engaging philosophic question concerning whether contemporary performers of historical pieces have an obligation to fulfill the intentions of the original composer. At the same time, there are moments in these chapters where one gets the sense that only those literate in notation, chord structures, and scales could get the full thrust of Grossman's provocative points.

With that said, the entire first section of articles in "Art and Morality" is well rounded, and the pieces surrounding the aforementioned on music are of interest to anyone concerned with aesthetics and art. Grossman's analyses range over the plastic and performing arts. The section concludes with a unique, aptly placed examination of human rights wherein Grossman draws an analogy between critical practices that establish aesthetic values and those establishing rights, which "are the emergents, though tentatively envisioned and proclaimed in advance, of processes of critical caring." (111).

Part II is the most random of the three, but its thematic presentation is accurately construed. Among "Artistic Philosophers and Philosophical Artists" examined is C. S. Peirce, an unlikely "artistic" philosopher, but Grossman provocatively gleans a "literary critical interpretation" from a simile of his in the widely anthologized "The Fixation of Belief." Then there is an interesting piece on Frederick J. Ruf, the previously referenced Sartre essay, a lengthy discussion of Monroe Beardsley, and an interesting discussion of Gotthold Lessing. The Lessing essay had not appeared previously in print.

Appearing next is an essay that merits separate critical mention both for its peculiar content, and for the light it sheds on an issue concerning the larger theme of Grossman's book. It is a most odd inclusion, titled "Lewis Carroll: Pedophile or Platonist?" Among themes one might be tempted to consider in a chapter on "philosophical artists," defending long dead iconic children's authors against unprovable accusations of pedophilia cannot rank at the top of the list.

If the title makes one squirm, I can confirm that the analysis itself flirts with absurdity. Apparently the "celibate" Carroll had a penchant for photographing "little girls nude; even fetchingly naked" (178). Grossman's characterization "fetchingly naked" clues readers into his own apparently "aesthetic" attitude towards the subject.

For readers like me who were not at first aware of accusations of pedophilia made against the Alice's Adventures in Wonderland author, Grossman's essay only serves to raise attention to the issue in a manner that, well, at the very least unintentionally contributes to the possibly unnecessary sullying of an author's reputation, and at worst shows Carroll as possibly guilty of crimes it is obliquely attempting to pardon.

This is not to suggest that the morality of Carroll's aesthetic preoccupations is a non-issue, nor that the relation between aesthetics and eroticism in which Grossman purports interest is somehow off limits. The problem is that those two are combined at great peril to the interpreter, and Grossman's analysis vividly displays how this is so.

Revealingly, the legitimate concern that is at stake for those taking up the question of the morality of Carroll's photographic fancies -- Were young children harmed and exploited by Carroll in his "interests?" -- is never even broached by Grossman. Indeed Grossman uses the exercise as a way of shaming moralists about Carroll's photography for their "narrowness" (189), as if the only reason they might look suspiciously at the author's meantime preoccupations is that they lack a certain "Platonizing impulse" (185).

Yuck. No. That is not the reason moralists worry about the issue. Grossman leaves entirely out of consideration the legitimate concern of said moralists. They worry: Were young, vulnerable girls exploited sexually by Carroll, in whom they probably invested a great deal of overblown trust and faith?

The fact that in the case of Carroll there is no hard evidence supporting a positive answer to the above question certainly exonerates him in a court of law, where the burden of evidence is to establish guilt. But speculative criticism is conducted in a very different sort of court, and the problem with Grossman's handling of the case -- in addition to the fact that he handles it at all in a book restricted to questions of aesthetics and art -- is that after he rightly points to the lack of evidence against his subject, he proceeds to want to use that same lack of evidence to clear Carroll of any possibility of moral blame.

At one point he strangely uses the opinion of New Yorker reviewer Anthony Lane of John Ruskin's pedophilia in order, apparently, to shame Lane of being guilty of "another kind of depravity" of which apparently Carroll's accusers are also guilty. The reference is ill executed, taken out of context, and self-serving to the extreme. Readers familiar with Lane's flourishing, teasing critical style immediately grasp Grossman's critical mis-use of his reflections on Ruskin.

Certainly the "pervert hunters" to which Grossman draws attention (178) that have in recent years been preoccupied with the offending articles of Carroll's photograph collection would be unmoved by his defenses of Platonic love. While it is true that those hunters use a lack of evidence unfairly against Carroll, Grossman himself comes off as too eager to speculate in the other (equally unfair) direction of the evidence and cast Carroll's photographic fetishes as preoccupations, not of the pervert but of (as a Ray Davies's song by the same title puts it mockingly) an "art lover."

If it is harsh to call this single unfortunate chapter Grossman's "weak defense of perverts," the harshness is lifted by the fact that he invokes a philosopher who arguably offers the strongest philosophic defense of an aesthetic, Platonic relationship to material realities: George Santayana. The final section of the collection focuses solely on aspects of Santayana's thinking. The pieces offer not only a fairer, better sense of Grossman's quirky genius, but add original, substantive critical insights to what has become a steadily expanding body of Santayana scholarship.

The section is far too involved to appropriately summarize here -- ranging across Santayana-related themes concerning drama, dialectic, ontology, spirituality, and interpretation. Suffice it to say that the final set of interpretations of Santayana's thinking help complete a circle of sorts regarding Grossman's central concern with the intersections of morality and art.

The final wonderful essay, "Ultimate Santayana" (a title-play on a famous essay by Santayana on Spinoza), offers what is for me an easier means of appreciating the relationship between morality and aesthetics that Grossman seems throughout the volume to want to articulate (the relationship he unnecessarily distorts, in my mind, in the Carroll piece). "Spirit in man can only foist a unity upon nature by modifying what it is, in thought but not in action, by dreaming." (293) This beautiful articulation of Santayana's notion of spirit is a worthy crowning moment in the volume, encapsulating Grossman's original, artist's ability to lend meaning to Santayana's philosophic categories in a manner amenable to living, breathing creatures like us.

In all it is wonderful to be able to survey and learn so much from a scholar whose career displays, on the whole, such unity and nobility of purpose. Grossman clearly enjoyed a flourishing career of speculative reflection, one undoubtedly amplified in myriad meaningful ways by his artistic life.