Art Rethought: The Social Practices of Art

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Nicholas Wolterstorff, Art Rethought: The Social Practices of Art, Oxford University Press, 2015, 331pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198747758.

Reviewed by Carolyn Korsmeyer, University at Buffalo


Philosophers of art have usually drawn their examples from the established fine arts such as painting, poetry, or music. Many recent theorists have expanded that repertoire to include popular arts such as television and movies as well. Nicholas Wolterstorff goes even further by redirecting our attention away from the fine arts altogether. Art Rethought begins with a critique of approaches to philosophy of art that have prevailed since the modern period, proceeds to a carefully outlined theory of art as social practice, and then demonstrates that theory with a set of examples that usually fly under the radar of philosophical attention: memorials, objects of veneration, social protest art, and work songs. The last chapters return to a more familiar topic: the recent art movements that deliberately defy and consternate expectations, what he calls the "art-reflexive art" of contemporary times. Overall, the book is thought-provoking, absorbing, and for the most part persuasive. It is also a good read.

The first two sections are devoted to a lengthy review and critique of what Wolterstorff terms the "grand narrative of art in the modern world" (273). He acknowledges and builds upon some well-known earlier scholarship that analyzes the advent of the modern concept of fine art, noting that with this emergence the concept of disinterested aesthetic attention becomes the recommended -- indeed the definitive -- way to appreciate art. The grand narrative is particularly "grand" because of its claim that art comes into its own only when regarded as an object of regard that liberates the mind and transcends quotidian practical concerns. A consequence of the rise of fine art and an emphasis on aesthetic attention is that other creative endeavors become sidelined, both theoretically (inasmuch as they are rarely the targets of interest for art theory) and culturally (for they seldom achieve the same acclaim). He seeks to restore philosophical interest in those endeavors with his treatment of artifacts that play a major social role but that rarely receive attention.

Not only is the grand narrative a distorting lens that blinkers theorists to arts that are not considered "fine," it also is not, and perhaps never was, a thoroughly adequate way to understand our interactions with artworks. In its place, Wolterstorff proposes a social practices account, acknowledging a debt to Alasdair MacIntyre's social practice approach to ethics (1981). Social practices are enacted within three broad categories: audiences and the ways they properly appreciate and evaluate works; artists and their discovery of the knowledge and techniques required to be a participant in the cultural production of a place and time; and performers and other presenters, who often act as a bridge between artist and public (97). The idea of a social practice is eminently suited to considering how art is produced and received, for it emphasizes what we might call cultural fluency. One must learn how to respond to art, and that know-how is acquired not only by formal education but also by the various ways that we become acquainted with social values, institutions, and the activities that surround them, including the history that has produced culture in the forms we now inhabit. Not only do we thereby recognize things that count as art, but we also absorb and refine standards for judging quality.

In advancing a social practice approach to understanding art, Wolterstorff avoids the shortfalls of the grand narrative and produces a robust and flexible theory suited to address a wider range of artifacts both historical and contemporary. Of central importance is the rejection of a narrow concept of the aesthetic that prescribes disinterested attention to works that count among the fine arts. Not that he rejects the importance of disinterested attention for all artworks, but rather that there are many other appropriate modes of engagement. Because the emphasis is on social practice, he notes the ways that artworks are presented to the public and the ways that audiences of different sorts engage with them -- in his terms, by means of different act-types (singing, worshipping, honoring, etc.). Aesthetically attending in the traditionally disinterested sense is also a relevant act-type, but now it is but one of several -- and by no means the one that is paradigmatic of the best way to approach a work of the arts.

Not only is Wolterstorff's social practice account rich and persuasive, it also provides some efficient ways to tackle a number of subjects of contention in aesthetics. For instance, he outlines a succinct and utterly commonsensical way to sort through debates over how to determine the interpretive meanings of a work. Theorists perennially haggle over the role of the intention of the artist to determine the meaning of a work, as opposed to interpretations that emerge in the reception of audiences and critics (with complex iterations of each position). In Wolterstorff's social practice analysis, rather than competing with one another, these options nest rather comfortably together. He identifies act-meaning to refer to the actions that the artist(s) undertook to bring about a work of the arts. This level of meaning refers to what the agent was trying to do (his or her "agent-reasons"), including what are more commonly termed "intentions." Grasping this type of meaning, which Wolterstorff terms maker-meaning, requires recognition of what the action of making a work signifies, so the emphasis is as much on the motive and process of creativity as on the finished product. As he states: "To grasp the maker-meaning of the object I must grasp the act-meaning of the action of making the object" (111). Of course, there are many, many cultural products for which grasping this sort of meaning is no longer possible, most notably artifacts such as the cave-paintings of France and Spain that are so old their meanings can only be surmised.

But it is not only an understanding of the acts of those ancient painters that we have lost, it is also the place that the cave paintings had in their societies. In other words, we also lack an understanding of their social-practice meaning -- the role they had in religion, hunting rituals, play, or whatever one might imagine would prompt such difficult practices, and for so long. Social-practice meaning is "the significance [a work] has when engaged by the public in accord with some extant social practice." (112) Maker-meaning is relatively stable, if only because it is limited by the span of a lifetime. Social-practice meaning, however, can change radically over time. Altarpieces whose maker-meanings included invitations to worship are now appreciated for their representational techniques and their formal aesthetic qualities, for example. As the public changes, so do social-practice meanings. Thus Wolterstorff cuts through some tangled theories of interpretation -- including whether there is one (set of) correct interpretations or indefinitely many -- with the sound declaration that:

There is no such thing as the social practice-meaning of some work of the arts period. The social practice-meaning of some painting when engaged as an object of religious veneration in a church is different from the social practice-meaning of that same painting when engaged as an object of aesthetic attention in a museum. Social practice-meaning is different in this way from maker-meaning; maker-meaning is not relative (112-13).

What is meant by "social practice" is illustrated and amplified thereafter in several chapters on art types that clearly do not fit the grand narrative: memorial art such as monuments and gravestones; art for veneration, such as the icons of Orthodox Christianity; social protest art; and a category called "art that enhances," where work songs and sailor shanties are located. (To the last he might have added lullabies, for as he notes, contemporary offices and ships rarely invite work songs. But parents still sing their children to sleep.) Each topic is introduced with a general analysis of the art type, followed by one or two chapters that elaborate the main thesis with specific examples. Social protest art, for instance, is illustrated by an extended, sensitive reading of Harriet Beecher Stowe's Uncle Tom's Cabin and by a chapter on the graphic works of K├Ąthe Kollwitz.

Once attention is drawn to the extensive presence of memorials in society, to pursue just one of these types, one realizes how much creative cultural production is overlooked by a concentration on fine art. Wolterstorff argues that the very structure of the world of memorials is different from other types of art (123). Memorials are not designed to engage the public in appreciative acts as are works of the fine arts. Memorials may serve to stir and preserve memory, but their central and more enduring role is to honor. Honoring is accomplished by means of gestures and stances that have very little to do with aesthetic delectation and more to do with performance of a social practice that conventionally honors. Paying honor, interestingly, is different from feeling respect (137). When one performs a bow before a monarch, for example, one thereby honors, whether or not one harbors internal anarchist feelings. While matters of convention, such practices are not arbitrary but are subject to a demand of "fittingness" whereby the act that counts as honor-paying suits the occasion or the individuals honored. Wolterstorff's intuitions about the fittingness of what counts as a memorial will not be shared by all. He declares his affinity with architectural or sculptural memorials rather than poetic or musical ones (147), partly because they are enduring objects rather than transitory events. Memorial murals on the walls of Belfast provide particular examples of paintings the purpose of which is to honor those who defied authority in the Irish conflicts. These relatively unfamiliar and unusual examples demonstrate the continuing point that aesthetic excellence is not a defining criterion for an object of art. As Wolterstorff states: "Whether or not they are well painted, their social-practice meaning as memorial art is not to be located in their aesthetic qualities." (156)

The more standardly recognized art world represents another social practice, and recent developments there present challenges to art theories of any sort. Many philosophers of art, perhaps most notably Arthur Danto (1981), have puzzled over how to position contemporary artworks that defy the very traditions of aesthetics and art theory. "Art-reflexive art," as Wolterstorff terms it, includes "works presented for viewing in some art institution that were (or are) arguably counterexamples to some component of the ideology of art current at the time" (274). The grand narrative is also inapplicable to art-reflexive art, but in this case the movements that comprise it stand squarely within the fine art traditions. (A paradigm of such works is Duchamp's Fountain, which Wolterstorff asserts actually initiated the tradition of art-reflexive art (285).) What, he asks, does such art do? Certainly it does not reward aesthetic attention; rather, it prompts us to think. Among the thoughts invited are those that inquire about the criteria for something being counted a work of art in the first place, implicitly challenging values of originality and creativity, technical skill, and aesthetic excellence.

Fitting art-reflexive art into a social practices account is not a simple matter, partly because of what Wolterstorff identifies as a paradox at the heart of these sorts of works: namely, inasmuch as they challenge the values of the art world, they put in play one kind of critically-engaged social practice. But because they subsequently become accepted into art history and hence into tradition, that initial practice is short-lived. As he puts it: "If some object that was engaged as a work of art-reflexive art is accepted by the art world as a work of art and presented for viewing in our museums, then it no longer actually functions as a work of art-reflexive art but only as an item in the history of art-reflexive art." (292) These ideas are elaborated and made specific with an illuminating chapter on the photographs of Sherrie Levine.

The final two chapters briefly circle back to the initial discussion of modern philosophies of the arts. Anticipating that readers will wonder why the subject of beauty has not arisen, Wolterstorff argues that beauty only enters art theory with the initiation of a mandate of aesthetic attention directed to the fine arts. Beauty is a minor consideration for a social practices approach, for evaluation of works issues from the practices themselves. The discussion in this section rather oddly focuses on Aquinas' treatment of beauty, paying only slight attention to the modern notion that gave rise to the concept of the aesthetic. The point of this chapter that fits best with the rest of the book concerns evaluation and the ways in which the success or failure of a work relates to the practice that gives rise to that art form, not to criteria of evaluation separate from those practices. Free from a limiting notion of the aesthetic, Wolterstorff notes how evaluation spreads to include matters of ethics and justice -- both squarely pertinent to memorials and social protest arts.

Readers from many backgrounds will find much of interest in this book, for the close relationship of issues in aesthetics to other philosophical debates is frequently noted and pursued. Wolterstorff's theory is appealing, as is his depth and breadth of learning. His examples are far-ranging and refreshing, and it is to be hoped that his attention to these neglected subjects will spur others also to take them seriously.


Danto, Arthur. (1981) The Transfiguration of the Commonplace. Harvard University Press.

MacIntyre, Alasdair. (1981) After Virtue: A Study in Moral Theory. Notre Dame University Press.