Art Scents: Exploring the Aesthetics of Smell and the Olfactory Arts

Art Scents

Larry Shiner, Art Scents: Exploring the Aesthetics of Smell and the Olfactory Arts, Oxford University Press, 2020, 355pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190089818.

Reviewed by Benjamin D. Young, University of Nevada, Reno


Larry Shiner's book is a great exploratory sniff of the aesthetics of smell and the myriad types of odorific arts. Shiner does a fantastic job of introducing those unfamiliar with the subject matter to the use of smells as artwork, as well as their importance within aesthetic experiences across history and cultures. The book offers a pluralist conception of art that makes room for worldwide olfactory aesthetics, drawing on numerous historical and contemporary examples of scent arts, introductory olfactory neuroscience, and careful philosophical analysis with easy-to-follow arguments.

The central moves in the core arguments are carefully laid out at the outset and elaborated throughout the book, ensuring the reader is not lost in this cross-disciplinary tome. An overview of Shiner's argument can be found at the outset (pages 4–9) with a rather exhaustive account of how the central argument will proceed across the chapters, as well as the function of each of the preludes, interludes, and postludes throughout the four parts of the book. The thesis of the book is that our olfactory capacities are robust enough to generate aesthetic experiences that allow us to cognitively appreciate and linguistically describe odorific artwork as a unique category of art and even as fine art.

The first three parts of the book allow us to arrive at Shiner's pluralist conception of art, with the fourth exploring applications to further aesthetic situations such as bodily scenting, environmental smellscapes, and gastronomy, as well as possible ethical implications for each. Part I lays out the traditional Western denigration of smell and the challenges these might pose for appreciating the aesthetics of smells and scents as possible forms of art. The motivation behind this part of the book is to establish the strongest evidence against considering olfaction as being capable of generating aesthetic experiences based on the meager nature of our perception of an olfactory object, our olfactory cognitive limitations, and the claimed primacy of affective processing in smell. Central to Part I is setting up and dismissing the traditional Kant-to-Scruton line of criticism of smell -- that it cannot generate an olfactory aesthetic, as it is incapable of generating "cognitively informed aesthetic discussion and judgment" (47). This sets up Part II, which explains how the deprecation of smell has been shaped by the deodorization of European and American lifestyles, which is neither accurate regarding the historical importance of smells in everyday life even within these cultures, nor universal when we look at world cultures. Part II further builds upon the philosophical and neuroscientific evidence of the previous chapters, to show that even our meager olfactory capacities can nonetheless rise to the cognitive sophistication required to have reflective aesthetic experiences and critical linguistic judgments. Part II ends with an affirmative claim that olfactory aesthetics is possible, transitioning to Part III, which develops Shiner's theory of olfactory aesthetics covering olfactory arts (in the plural) as any kind of artwork that makes (a) intentional and (b) deliberative use of (c) actual odors, as well as scent art (olfactory art in the singular) to capture those further pieces of artwork developed by artists to be shown in institutional settings such as museums and galleries. The definition is not offered as an exhaustive set of necessary and sufficient conditions, but suitably sets up our appreciation of scent art as a distinctive category in the same vein as sound art. While it might be a distinctive category, its instances are a heterogenous myriad of types of art forms, some even rising to the honorific status of Fine Art. Probably the most philosophically rewarding portion of the book comes toward the end of Part III with its intricate discussion of the status of perfume that is certainly Fine Art on aesthetic definitions of art, while according to contextualist theories only some perfumes created for display in the right sorts of institutional settings would be considered art. If this latter approach is embraced it would cause the demotion of most perfumes to the realm of design art, but Shiner argues that we needn't worry because the distinction between types of artworks can be maintained without institutional elitism if we accept his pluralist conception of art.

There is much to like about the book and its central argument. Aside from providing a tremendous number of fantastic worldwide examples of scent art and an aesthetic structure of preludes, interludes, and postludes to draw the reader into the world of scent art, it offers a great introduction to the aesthetics of smell and a nuanced discussion of how we might conceive of odorific artworks as a unified category with a spectrum of types. To the best of my knowledge the book is the first of its kind and an important contribution to the literature on art and aesthetics. The book offers an easy-to-follow exploratory approach to a range of topics in an overlooked area. It is well written and researched, making for an enjoyable read for just about anyone interested in the art and aesthetics of odor objects. But, given the sheer breadth of material, debates, and theories covered, it is questionable if it always has the necessary depth for its claimed target audience. From the introduction, the book is intended for philosophers, artists, designers, art critics, and a general audience interested in arts and smell. However, its primary contribution is in aesthetics and philosophy of art. As the book progresses it becomes apparent that the driving motivation is to make room for scent arts within the American and European perspective of high art, with its negative appraisals of smell. The author does argue against such philosophical frameworks of theorizing about art and offers a pluralist conception that makes room for a worldwide olfactory aesthetics, and shows great knowledge of and sensitivity to other cultures' use of smell within art practices. Yet often the "Western" perspective seems to be treated with greater import, which is perhaps fitting given that the book is primarily aimed at making an impact in aesthetics and philosophy of art.

The book is a great read, yet the target audience might be more limited than the broad marketing demographic noted above. The book is too perfunctory in some areas -- its coverage of theories within the philosophy of smell is lacking and the chemosensory scientific coverage is cursory. In a number of instances in-depth coverage of the philosophy and science of smell would have bolstered the central argument. There is a noticeable omission of some philosophers of smell who argue for the objective nature of smell perception. Their research generates an even stronger argument that we can perceive complex mereologically structured smells as objects with aesthetic properties that would not just make room for olfactory aesthetic experience but blunt the Kant-to-Scruton line of criticism. Also, the neuroscientific and psychological literature surveyed overplays a single strand of research suggesting that smells are primarily treated in terms of their affective component, which is certainly a prevalent opinion, yet arguably not the contemporary default position within the chemosciences. Shiner is diligent in stating his distinctions and arguments for the purpose of making a primary contribution within aesthetics and philosophy of art, but those interested in the philosophy of olfactory perception and neuroscience of smell would do well to consult other books on the philosophy of smell that are also oriented to general audiences, such as Andreas Keller's Philosophy of Olfactory Perception or Ann-Sophie Barwich's Smellosophy.

The book takes up the rallying cry of not neglecting smell. And this might just be a matter of rhetorical preferences, but can we just stop apologizing for smell? Asking if our substantial olfactory capacities can play nicely with the conceptual system developed by ocularcentric European traditions has its place if we are seeking permission to take olfactory arts seriously within certain elitist frameworks, but olfactory aesthetics offers us so much more than that. The book laudably devotes time to broaden our appreciation for the range of aesthetic smell possibilities outside of "Western" cultures and the fine arts. But despite an awful lot of space devoted to discussing the high arts, all the fine distinctions do not make it clear what is really at stake in the debate. For outsiders to this area this is frustrating. Tracking all the different usages of 'art' is tedious and the exhaustive analysis does not provide much satisfaction when at last a pluralist conclusion is arrived at.

I would like to echo the book's closing sentence by imploring the reader to learn more about the philosophy of smell and scent art, for there are many early career researchers whose work deserves greater engagement. Shiner's gloss on the philosophy of olfactory perception does not mention research by Solveig Aasen, Barwich, Chiara Brozzo, Giulia Martina, Becky Millar, Błażej Skrzypulec, Dan Cavedon-Taylor, or Keith A. Wilson. Of course, some omissions are understandable given how quickly the philosophy of smell is developing and how long it takes to get a book to publication.

Given the rapid development of the odorific art scene let me conclude with a recent example that nicely illustrates scent as high art and its power to engage us in discovering worldwide olfactory aesthetic experiences. Scents of Exile by Brian Goeltzenleuchter was recently exhibited at Olfactory Art Keller (an art gallery devoted to smell art in New York City). The exhibit included eight pure works of odor art that were accessible from free-standing hand sanitizer dispensers. Each piece was designed to provide access to an immigrant's scent memory and get the smeller to engage with a refugee's experience from a first-personal access point. The exhibit is an excellent example of how scents can be used to generate works of fine art even by the standards of contextualist theories. However, selecting this contemporary example also shows how olfactory art provides a direct access point to aesthetic experiences that engage us to move beyond our "Western" olfactory perspectives.