Articulating the World: Conceptual Understanding and the Scientific Image

Placeholder book cover

Joseph Rouse, Articulating the World: Conceptual Understanding and the Scientific Image, University of Chicago Press, 2015, 423pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226293844.

Reviewed by Robert Nola, University of Auckland


Joseph Rouse has written a wide-ranging, systematic attempt to give an account of naturalism and to solve some of the problems confronting it. He gives many of the basic concepts that are often employed in articulating naturalism a novel twist, one that breaks ground for research at new levels. Rouse's book will have a central place in debates about naturalism that will surely follow from the many important theses he advances. In this review I will focus on three of his themes: what naturalism might be and some problems it faces, the role given to niche construction theory in articulating and sustaining the naturalist stance, and the idea of a "scientific image".

Naturalism and its problems

Rouse's account of naturalism and the issues confronting it owe much to Wilfred Sellars' stance in "Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man" and to those "left-Sellarsians", mainly John McDowell, Robert Brandom and John Haugeland, who developed Sellars's theses. (This lineage helps explain why Rouse's prose has a certain degree of denseness.) A host of other philosophers put in an appearance. They include Davidson, who is understood to be sympathetic to Rouse's approach; Quine, who is deemed not so sympathetic, especially over issues to do with normativity within naturalism; and Heidegger, who provides a characteristic philosophical contribution. Though in Sellars's account the "scientific image" is norm free, it is the "manifest image" concerning the place of humans in the world which centrally involves normativity. The manifest image is "fraught with ought". So one central problem that faces any naturalist is to show how there can be a "fusion" of the two images which leaves nothing out for the naturalist (especially in respect of normativity). The tricky notion here is that of providing the required "fusion" (whatever that might be). In Sellars the fusion seems to be largely a matter of "joining" (perhaps more than mere conjunction) rather than reconciliation; but Rouse moves well beyond this.

What is naturalism? The emphasis in the book is on scientific naturalism. Little is said about naturalism concerning mathematical entities (numbers, sets, etc.) or other entities that might be said to "exist" such as abstracta of various sorts (e.g., meanings, possible worlds, properties (though Sellars is a strict nominalist)). Naturalism has at least four aspects. Firstly, there is a rejection of anything supernatural. Secondly, there is the broad thesis that the (empirical) sciences themselves are to provide the understanding required to deal with all aspects of not just the world absent any human beings (the traditionally understood "scientific image"), but also all aspects of humans and their lives (i.e., the denizens of the manifest image). Thirdly, given the way in which science undergoes development at the level of concepts as well as hypotheses, there is a need to pay attention to the best available scientific research in order to provide the best in explanatory understanding in all domains (and this without any kind of expectations or preconceptions which might be limiting to science). Fourthly, there is a need to account for the way in which science is importantly authoritative so that there is no room left for a "first philosophy" which will in some sense undercut the independent authority of science (see p. 3 and p. 345).

Given this account of naturalism, what are the problems it faces? Clearly each of the sciences face problems within its respective domain of phenomena to be explained. But we can be optimistic in that, given the history of the growth of science, science will continue to be spectacular in solving these problems (whatever be our account of the nature of that growth). However, there is one problem which looms so large that it appears to undermine the very hope of working out a viable naturalism. As Rouse puts it: 'The most pressing challenge for naturalism today is to show how to account for our own capacities for scientific understanding as a natural phenomenon that could be understood scientifically. Naturalist views that cannot meet this challenge would be self-defeating' (pp. 6-7). To meet this challenge Rouse develops an original theory of conceptual understanding in terms of discursive niche construction in order to fend off naturalism's threatening lacuna. Whereas some philosophers might see issues such as this as a counter-example which brings about the downfall of naturalism, Rouse sees it as a challenge to be met by pushing further along with the project of naturalism. At best it is an incomplete programme but with no obvious "no go" areas.

Niche construction theory and the naturalist stance

Much of Part 1 is devoted to a theory of conceptual understanding, from conceptualisation as it occurs in relation to our experience all the way to conceptualisation as found in language, science and reasoning. Rouse's challenge to the naturalist is to ask how our understanding of conceptualisation is to find a place within the project of a scientific naturalism. To this end he draws on resources found within current philosophical theorizing (the "left Sellarsians" play a big role here) and scientific theorizing in psychology, biology and evolution, which are then applied to language, perception and more general conceptual understanding. Within evolution natural selection plays a paramount role; but many claim that this is now very closely followed by the role played by "niche construction", broadly understood to be the way in which, for many populations of organisms, their survival turns on the way in which they interact with their environments. What organisms do when they are active in making their own niches is alter the selection pressures on their population; understanding this leads theoreticians to reconceive how evolution is to be understood given the prominence of "niche construction".

In the case of humans there are many dimensions of previous "niche construction". At a certain point in our history we developed a niche for language use. But this might well have arisen from a pre-linguistic context of gesturing and posturing which was eventually followed by vocal expression leading to a wide range of linguistic competences. Understood this way, language use cannot be merely due to the way in which our ancestors developed an internal capacity for symbolic representation. As Rouse suggests, the problematic here is reconstrued within niche construction theory, which gets us to see how language use and other activities such as perception are to be taken as "constructivist" activities reinforced by evolution. Considerations such as these lead to Rouse's novel account of not just conceptual understanding in science but also the naturalistic basis in science that it has, thereby rescuing naturalism from a serious lacuna that would undermine it. In doing this Rouse provides a novel perspective in placing the work of Sellars and the "left Sellarsians" in the context of recent science that takes niche construction theory to have a major role in accounting for language and conceptual understanding.

Scientific image

What is the "scientific image"? This is a term of art introduced by Sellars. But there is not just one such image but several rival images (as Rouse recognises in chapter 6) which are of varying degrees of specificity (in fact the Sellars' account leaves out some important aspects of science). For example, members of the Vienna Circle proposed various manifestos in their various accounts of a "positivistic" scientific image. van Fraassen in The Scientific Image gave us an image which does not espouse naturalism and advocates an anti-realist version of constructive empiricism. Yet others have an image of science in which it is a patchwork of models. Finally, Sellars adopts a realist stance and views the various sciences as composites in which theories and their ontologies such as physics, biology, physiology, psychology and the social sciences are open to unification (to the extent that this is possible). All of this stands in contrast to the "manifest image" of humans-in-the-world. If the scientific image itself has yet to achieve some degree of unity then there seems to be an inescapable disunity between the scientific and manifest images as described by Sellars. It is this disunity which Rouse sees as one of the main problems to overcome in articulating naturalism.

Rouse proposes a new way of understanding the scientific image so that naturalism is less problematic. He tells us that he (chapter 11, section II) 'has developed a conception of scientific understanding as embedded in the scientific research enterprise rather than in bodies of knowledge extractable from it' (p. 365). Also: 'Situating scientific understanding within its "natural habitat" of the ongoing research enterprise thereby offers a fundamentally different sense of "the scientific image"' (p. 368). In fact: 'The alternative developed treats "the scientific image" not as a set of claims to be taken as true (or empirically adequate, instrumentally reliable, etc.) but as an ongoing reconfiguration of the space of reasons itself' (loc. cit.). Here one finds an account of "scientific activity" that can be viewed from the perspective of niche construction theory (albeit in an expanded sense).

There is a lot to take on board here that needs to be left to interpretation by avid Sellarsians. However if one were to think that the scientific image is to be characterised by only the ongoing research enterprise (described by Rouse in several chapters of Part II) then one might have mistaken Rouse's enterprise. In a footnote (p. 368, fn. 25) he emphasizes: 'The various philosophical interpretations of the scientific image as a body of knowledge are part of the scientific image in my sense'. So it turns out that Rouse's scientific image has several aspects that one might not immediately find in Sellars.

First, there is the way in which "the space of reasons" finds its place in not just the manifest image but also the scientific image, where it has an expanded role in accounting for reasoning with new conceptual development. Talk of "the space of reasons" is another Sellarsian term of art which characterises knowledge in a way which is not merely descriptive; rather in the case of knowledge 'we are placing it in the logical space of reasons, of justifying and being able to justify what one says' (Sellars, "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind", section 36). Rouse is revisionary when he adds to the extension of term 'the space of reasons': 'I instead locate scientific understanding in the ongoing reconfiguration of the entire space. The sciences continually revise the terms and inferential relations through which we understand the world' (pp. 206-7). So the space of reasons is not just the arena where justification takes place; it is also the arena in which inferential semantics determines our conceptual understanding as science develops.

A second revision concerns what we might call the "process" aspect of ongoing scientific research; this is the "doing" which is characteristic of scientific activity in the laboratory and elsewhere. Thirdly, there are the outcomes of these experimental doings which we might call the "end product" of the process: that is, the process ends up with sets of claims which are part of the body of knowledge, or belief, of science. It is from these claims that scientists can extract the ontology of various theories postulated in the scientific image.

Are we to understand Sellars as locating the space of reasons in the manifest image and not the scientific image? If so, then in contrast Rouse seems to find a place for "the space of reasons" within the scientific image itself. Rouse understands Sellars's position thus: 'The manifest image locates us within the "space of reasons" in which normative authority is constituted, including the normative authority of science itself' (p. 8). Let us set aside how the normative authority of science itself could be constituted within the manifest image with its "space of reasons". On the face of it Rouse seems to advocate a new conception of the scientific imagine that might well avoid problems concerning normativity; the space of reasons now has a place in the scientific image. How this bears on Rouses' initial problem for naturalism and its apparent avoidance of anything normative is something that can be left to other commentators, but it would appear that this initial problem does not loom as large given Rouse's reconstrual of the Sellarsian scientific image so that it also provides a place for "the space of reasons".

What this suggests is that there is more to the scientific image as reconstrued by Rouse than meets the eye. Not only are there process and product aspects of science to take into account: there are also methodological aspects, where methodology is understood epistemically as providing aims and rules for playing the game of science. This is part of the game of epistemic assessment, which can be played within "the space of reasons" understood as the place within science where justification is to be found.

For the sake of illustrating the revisions being made here, consider the case of the subjective Bayesian. (Probabilistic reasoning as part of the image of science does not get much airing in the book despite its significance in theories of method). One of the things subjective Bayesians (and other Bayesians) must do, when considering the claims of science, is to distribute their degrees of belief in the various claims of science in accordance with the probability calculus. Some powerful theorems tell us that not to do this would mean that a putative Bayesian would always be a loser in playing the game of science against nature. This is important for the "rationality" of Bayesian scientific method. Insofar as Bayesianism is an important methodology within science, it will have a role in "the space of reasons" in providing an account of justification. But this account does not turn on some ineffable "ought" of epistemology that might be worrying for a naturalist. Rather it is a means-end ought that is readily tamed for naturalism since it can well have an empirical basis (within, say a reliability epistemology or a version of normative naturalism of the sort described by Larry Laudan). So one could allow theories of method such as Bayesianism to be part of the scientific image, alongside process and product aspects; and it contains a place for normativity without necessarily upsetting naturalism. None of this is set out in Rouse's book but it does show one of the ways in which his account of an expanded idea of the elements of a "scientific image" might be developed.

* * * * * * *

Sellars begins his "Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man" by stating: 'The aim of philosophy, abstractly formulated, is to understand how things in the broadest possible sense of the term hang together in the broadest possible sense of the term'. We can apply this quip to the Sellarsian philosophical project itself in which Rouse is engaged. Just how do the various elements of the expanded Sellarsian philosophical project hang together given the way its central concepts can be variously characterised in different phases of the project? Rouse has given us one of the latest incarnations of what the elements of the programme might be and how they might hang together. In so doing he has given us new insights into how that project, along with naturalism, can be advanced.