Artificial Presence: Philosophical Studies in Image Theory

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Lambert Wiesing, Artificial Presence: Philosophical Studies in Image Theory, Nils F. Schott (tr.), Stanford UP, 2010, 148pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804759410.

Reviewed by Katrina Mitcheson, Bath Spa University



Lambert Wiesing’s collection of studies on the image, made available in English by Nils F. Schott’s translation, offers both a case for the importance of image studies and a broad introduction to this area of philosophical enquiry. His work is an exercise in the conceptual analysis of the image. Wiesing considers what things belong to the category of images. What this exercise reveals is the existence, explicitly and often implicitly, of competing understandings of what an image is. By providing an introduction to different approaches in image studies Wiesing also shows how various notions of the nature of an image are embedded in different philosophical methodologies. Through considering the implications of different understandings of images, Wiesing brings to light the need, when dealing with images as part of philosophical discussions, for example in the philosophy of art, to be more explicit about the understanding of images being employed. There is, therefore, ample reason for us to take seriously the question: what is an image?

As the title, Artificial Presence, indicates, Wiesing takes the specific characteristic of images to be that they make visible an object which is “only artificially, present” (ix). This, he suggests, implies that “the image opens up a view on reality liberated from the constraints of physics” (ix). His book is written in a spirit that acknowledges that this leaves us with a further task of clarification and exploration. Wiesing presents and explores his understanding of the concept of the image through a series of separate studies, which serve to set out clearly the core questions in image studies that merit further research. He describes his series of studies as an analysis of the relation between the concept of the image and other concepts, such as ‘the sign’ and ‘the window’.

Employing the tools of phenomenology, in particular the philosophy of Husserl (not entirely uncritically), Wiesing’s studies provide some provisional answers to the problem of the image. As such his book provides a useful introduction for both students and researchers whose work engages with images, yet who are new to image studies as a field of enquiry that asks explicitly what images are. If we are interested in the function of images or in the aesthetic experience that certain images afford us, and how this aesthetic experience may or may not be unique to images, it is appropriate that we first engage with the problem of what an image is. This is also pertinent to those of us who are interested in whether the way in which an image is produced is relevant to its function and aesthetic possibilities. For example, comparative philosophy of painting and photography could benefit from considering the nature of their common classification as images. Wiesing’s set of studies provides a useful starting point for such reflection and offers a survey of historical contributions in this area.

The first study (Chapter 1) takes up the issue of what image studies is concerned with. Wiesing distinguishes the study of individual images, groups of images, and the image itself, the last of these being the philosophical concern of image theory. The move to this final topic is, he insists, a step from an empirical to a conceptual enquiry. As such it requires a distinct methodology in order to investigate the categorization of images as opposed to a set of objects whose classification is taken as given. This brief chapter serves by way of introduction to the more substantive sections that follow.

The next chapter provides an extremely helpful overview of existing approaches to image theory. Wiesing describes an anthropological approach, which begins from the assumption that images are artifacts; a semiotic approach, which treats images as signs; and a phenomenological approach, which takes as its base point the recognition that images are visible objects and seeks to establish what the distinct form of visibility is that images possess. Wiesing associates these approaches with particular thinkers and considers their contributions and limitations. It is in this chapter that the book’s greatest strength — to introduce the reader to the questions and methodology of image studies — is most apparent. The differences in these approaches highlight for Wiesing that what remains in question is what an image is: “What is important is the mutual reproach that the other approach commits a fundamental category mistake” (21).

In Chapter 2 Wiesing rejects the thesis that images are necessarily signs, a thesis that he develops more fully in Chapter 3, where he offers a stronger positive argument than he does in some of the more speculative sections. Here he makes a compelling case for the need to ask when images are signs. Wiesing stresses that the claim that "Images can but they do not have to function as signs" must not be conflated with the stronger claim that there are some images that are not signs (27). Whether an image is a sign cannot be established by reference to the image alone. Rather the position that Wiesing advocates is a functionalist understanding of images as signs, where some images happen not to operate as signs. Wiesing shows the semiotic view of images is problematic by asking "What does the world image mean in the sentence The image refers [bezieht sich] to something?" (29). Wiesing suggests that we need the Husserlian distinction between image carrier and image object to make sense of various different statements that employ the ambiguous term image. He argues that it is the image object that operates as the signifier; “the image carrier is not the sign carrier but displays the sign carrier”, in the same way that any other object can be used as a sign (35). This function depends on the context in which the image object appears: “every assignment of sense is contingent; not only can it be different; it does not have to be all” (49).

This kind of clarification is also present in Wiesing’s succinct Chapter 5, where he draws on Husserl to describe the limits of the metaphor of the window in relation to images. A topic, which, through the notion of transparency, connects with this metaphor, is the short discussion of media, rather than merely images, given in Chapter 8. Here Wiesing again employs Husserlian concepts and argues that “Media are necessary for a separation between genesis and validity” (128). Media make possible a conceptual distinction between the physical process and its non-physical production, which allows that “the very same thing can be seen, heard, and thought at different times, in different places, by different people” (133).

A more concrete application of Wiesing’s understanding of the image is developed in discussion of the question “What Could ‘Abstract Photography’ be?” in Chapter 4. Wiesing approaches this question in terms of the reasons for abstraction in photography. He suggests that “abstract photography wants to answer the question of what a photo is” and thus "the abstract photo is a kind of experiment for the question What makes a photograph possible?" (71, 72). Abstract photography can bring the structure of visibility in a photograph to light because it “can forgo displaying a thing in order thus to show how a photo displays an object” (71). It may, alternatively, operate to show how a photograph can be an image and not a sign. In response to this task it creates

an image object that refuses the obvious use as a sign for a thing that bears visible resemblance to it because this image object does not, at least not in this way, bear resemblance to any known real thing (74).

Finally, and more controversially, Wiesing claims that abstract photographs might show that photographs are not always images. The question is, can one abstract from even this aspect of photographs and still be doing photography? Wiesing suggests photographic objects, which are not purely visible but can be touched and smelt, achieve this. There is not enough in this short study however, to convince the reader that ‘photo objects’, such as Gottfried Jäger’s Graukeil (1983), are in fact produced through photographic means. The discussion of this example remains frustratingly brief. This chapter would have benefited from a more extended argument to show that this abstraction does not turn out to remove what is essential from photography, or at least from some explanation concerning the production of this so-called ‘photo object’. Wiesing does not explain if, and how, this object is produced according to his own broad definition of photography, in which materials react to electromagnetic rays. It is not obvious that the use of photographic paper is in itself enough to make this art work an example of photography. Not enough is said here to avoid the sense that it is arbitrary whether or not we consider the experiment of abstraction undertaken by Jäger to qualify as photography.

Another concrete study is Chapter 6’s consideration of virtual reality. This is a timely discussion, which distinguishes virtual reality from immersion and shows the need for research into the new kinds of image objects that new media present, notably the interactive image object of simulation. It raises more questions than it answers, but they are pertinent and clearly delineated.

One of the most interesting chapters, which also faces some problems concerning the interpretation it offers, is the penultimate chapter on Plato’s concept of Mimesis. Wiesing makes a compelling case that to read Plato’s criticisms of Mimesis as referring to images, rather than copies, or replicas, renders many of his statements ridiculous. Wiesing suggests that once we differentiate between depiction and replication we can render Plato’s critique more plausible. Many of Plato’s statements about imitation make most sense if understood to refer to replication. Wiesing acknowledges, however, that Plato at times refers explicitly to images, and develops a reading in which Plato is understood as engaged with a canon in which images involve replication. For instance, sculptures of gods in the context of Greek theology are surrogates, whose properties should match the realities of physical proportion and not alter them to suit the audience’s perspective. It is the deviation from this understanding of replication in favor of mimicking appearance which Plato then criticizes and contrasts to truth. As it stands this discussion suggests an interesting route of interpretation but one which needs to be connected to the art form on which Plato himself focuses: tragic poetry (in The Republic‘s Book X). Wiesing’s piece is thus incomplete if assessed as an interpretation of Plato. Another concern I had was that Wiesing’s discussion was not adequately integrated with a discussion of the Forms. At the end of this study Wiesing does bring his thesis into relation with Plato’s metaphysics, suggesting that Plato’s concern over images that are presented as accurate copies stems from its connection “to the introduction of a viewer’s perspective, and it is this perspective, precisely, that does not exist in the case of copies” (119). I feel this interesting point would have benefited from further discussion and its relevance could have been demonstrated throughout this short and intriguing study.

In summary Wiesing’s collection offers a good introduction to an important topic. He provides a clear analysis of the questions that need asking and offers some interesting responses to these questions. There are times, however, when it is all too apparent that some of these pieces are redactions of longer works and we are left wanting a more sustained and complete argument in support of Wiesing’s answer to the question: what are images, and how does the concept of the image fit into our conceptual scheme?