At the Heart of Reason

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Claude Romano, At the Heart of Reason, Michael B. Smith and Claude Romano (trs.), Northwestern University Press, 2015, 635pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780810131378.

Reviewed by Scott Davidson, Oklahoma City University


A tectonic shift is taking place in French philosophy in the 21st century. While French philosophers of the past largely ignored work in Analytic philosophy, it has now become an essential part of the academic training of young scholars in France, thus giving rise to a new style of French thinker who is equally versed in the so-called Continental and Analytic traditions. Claude Romano, a professor at the University of Paris-Sorbonne, is a prime example of this new breed of scholar and also a leading voice in French philosophy today. This book, Romano's sixth, marks his most ambitious project to date and is essential reading for anyone who is interested in pursuing a substantive dialogue between Continental and Analytic traditions of thought.

The book is an ambitious project (over 600 pages) that addresses many of the major 20th century debates across the Continental-Analytic divide. Romano's effort throughout is twofold he: provides a reasoned defense of the phenomenological project against some of its 20th century critics and utilizes the best of those criticisms to inform the future direction of phenomenology. Romano contends that phenomenology's main concern, and its true source of originality, is the development of a "new image of Reason". Against the proponents of the linguistic turn and various forms of linguistic idealism which would reduce meaning to language, Romano draws from this phenomenological image of reason to advocate for an "experiential turn" that includes sensibility as a part of reason (527) and leads back to the pre-predicative structures of experience that make the world available to language.

Structurally, the book has two major sections -- "Confrontations" and "Transformations" -- each of which could have been a freestanding book in its own right. The first, "Confrontations," comprises a dozen chapters that address a variety of "external critiques" of Husserlian phenomenology that have come from the Analytic tradition. Two prominent themes emerge over the course of these chapters. The first concerns the relation between language and experience, which has been a major point of contention between Husserl and his critics. Husserl, as is widely known, regards language as an unproductive layer of meaning that is merely a supplement to pre-predicative "lived experience". But, against this claim, Romano invokes a number of thinkers, including Brentano, Frege, Russell, Wittgenstein, and Ernst Tugendhat, who have rejected any attempt to decouple experience from language. Exemplary among these is Romano's discussion of Tugendhat's critique of Husserl.

Tugendhat develops a linguistic critique of Husserl's essential finding: the concept of intentionality. Despite Husserl's claim that intentionality is an essential feature of consciousness, Tugendhat utilizes linguistic analysis to unmask Husserl's discovery as only a grammatical feature of transitive verbs which always have a direct object. Intentionality thus turns out to be only a grammatical feature of our language rather than an essential structure of conscious experience. A further argument by Tugendhat challenges the purported primacy of conscious experience in relation to language. Husserl's pre-predicative experience is not conceivable, he contends, because nothing can be given to us outside of language. To say that something is given independently of language is to make a statement in language. So, Husserl's defense of pre-predicative experience turns out to be self-refuting. In response to this reductio argument, Romano acknowledges that language is needed to express an experience but denies that it is needed in order for something to be given in experience. Indeed, in the development of his own original account of pre-predicative experience to which I will return later, Romano stands Tugendhat's linguistic critique on its head and reintegrates language and experience in such a way that language itself comes to be given within experience.

The second major theme that emerges in "Confrontations" has to do with the debate over the synthetic a priori or what Husserl calls the "material a priori". This is indeed a central part of the phenomenological tradition's attempt to articulate the essential structures of lived experience. While it is impossible to do justice to all of the detailed considerations involved here, one highlight is Romano's discussion of color. This begins with an analysis of such statements as "all color is extended" and "there are four primary colors that tend neither to one side nor the other" that are difficult to describe either as analytic truths or empirical facts. Through a discussion of some of Wittgenstein's remarks on color and a fascinating analysis of the notion of "transparent white", Romano makes the case that there is a logic of color that is both necessary and a priori to the extent that it provides a norm for all possible color statements.

Regardless of the side one takes on this debate, every reader will find that Romano covers this terrain with great patience and care, addressing many of the leading figures in this debate such as Schlick, Wittgenstein, Quine, Fine, and Kripke. Romano's analysis is especially effective, it seems to me, in highlighting the dangers of misinterpretation that can result from simply transposing the established set of concepts in Analytic philosophy directly on to Husserl's thought. It is due to such mistakes, according to Romano, that Schlick's supposed refutation of Husserl's material a priori does not hold up to scrutiny, and conversely, this is also the reason why some analytic defenders of the synthetic a priori end up being much closer to Husserl than they realize. In Romano's careful and detailed engagement with the issue of the synthetic a priori, readers will thus find a useful conceptual map that aligns two traditions that usually do not address one another directly on this central philosophical question.

The book’s second part, "Transformations", could be described as an "immanent critique" of the phenomenological field in which Romano carefully sorts out "what is alive and what is dead" in phenomenology at the dawn of the 21st century (12). These chapters, likewise, can be organized around two sets of questions. In chapters 13 through 18, Romano sets out to transform the Husserlian account of perception by developing a broader and more holistic approach to experience. After developing this more robust account of experience, Chapters 19 through 23 then return to the question of the relation between language and the world.

Instead of establishing our experiential contact with the world through the direct perception of objects, Romano draws inspiration from the work of Merleau-Ponty and Heidegger in harkening back to a pre-theoretical contact with the world that precedes the subject-object relation. Our experience, Romano contends, is rooted primordially in our pragmatic engagement with the world. Our practical capacities are coping skills that help us to know how to deal with given situations in the world. Yet, that is not to say that the meaning of our experience depends wholly on subjective capabilities and interests either; its meaning is also determined by the situation in which the subject is cast. Experience, according to Romano, must therefore be defined in terms of the broader structure of our being-in-the-world, which includes our subjective capacities as well as the given circumstances in which they are exercised.

The true highlight of the latter half of the book, however, is Chapter 19 "The Myths of the Given and the Kantian Framework" in which Romano stakes out his phenomenology of experience in relation to Analytic discussions of the myth of the given (primarily by Sellars, Davidson, and McDowell). This problem concerns the supposed "non-conceptual content" of experience, or in other words, the given. Sellars is known for his argument that all conscious experience of things is a linguistic affair. In so doing, he criticizes standard models of perception for assuming the given and then building conceptual knowledge on the basis of an indubitable and non-conceptual presence of given data. In a Hegelian manner, Sellars suggests that the given is always conceptually mediated by a broader context and then goes on to conclude that perception is propositional in its very nature.

John McDowell, in Mind and World, famously tries to rework this view and adopt a different notion of givenness that does not entail a wholesale rejection of the given. His aim, instead, is to provide a "therapy" that helps to cure the standard or "Kantian" way of thinking about the given. As an alternative, McDowell ends up endorsing the view that only a new conception of experience as conceptual through and through can legitimate our initial openness to the world. But, while this notion of a prior opening to the world that precedes perception would seem to resonate with the work of Heidegger and Gadamer, Romano contends that McDowell "changes its meaning to the point of making it unrecognizable" (429). This is because McDowell's openness to the world is not really open and does not really have a concept of the world; it remains a form of intellectualism that restricts this openness to linguistic expressions.

Romano's criticism leads in to his own account of what it means to be "open to the world." What, in other words, is the relation of language to our original being in the world? In response to this question, Romano suggests that a similar transformation to the one undergone by perceptual intentionality in the previous chapters is needed. This means that linguistic meaning, likewise, should be treated in a holistic manner, that is, as a system formed through the conjunction of a subject endowed with practical abilities and its situation in the world. Beyond this analogy, I must confess that I find it hard to discern Romano's view clearly, but I think the gist is that language should not be separated from our experiential world but that it too belongs to the fabric of that world.

This reflection on the linguistic element of experience naturally leads Romano to a brief engagement with the hermeneutic phenomenology of Ricœur and Gadamer, and this is the point where I spot a missed opportunity in his analysis. Romano suggests that the hermeneutic view operates as a sort of transcendental schematism in which narratives play the leading role in constituting the meaning of experience. On such a view, our experience would become intelligible only through its organization in a narrative that configures it. But in his criticism of hermeneutics, Romano omits the sense in which Ricœur and other hermeneuts would also speak about the readability of the world. Instead of being a formless and mute given, their view is that the world contains a prior readability -- a pre-configuration - that admits of a narrative structure. As a result, narrative intelligibility is not created by the subject ex nihilo but rather emerges out of a world that pre-delineates a narrative configuration. Thus, in contrast with Romano, I would suggest that the power of the subject to schematize experience, exemplified by the ability to tell a story, is always intertwined with the readability of the world. Together they form a system that defines what it means to live in a language, which is perhaps also conveyed by Wittgenstein's remark that "to imagine a language is to imagine a form of life."

If the aim of At the Heart of Reason is to show that the sensible experience is a part of reason and that language is part of the world, I am not yet convinced that Romano has provided an adequate account of this fundamental openness. But I have no doubt that this remarkable book has put us on the right path to accomplish such a task.