Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation

Placeholder book cover

Johann Gottlieb Fichte, Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation, Allen Wood (ed.), Garrett Green (tr.), Cambridge UP, 2010, 158pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521130189.

Reviewed by Matthew C. Altman, Central Washington University



In Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation (1792), J. G. Fichte extends Kant’s practical philosophy to a consideration of revealed religion: its justification, its use, and the limits of what it can claim. Kant had warranted our practical faith in God and immortality in his Critique of Practical Reason (1788), but Fichte was the first to explain the implications of this approach for religion, predating even Kant’s own Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (1793).

This edition of Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation uses an already existing translation by Garrett Green, which was published by Cambridge in 1978, along with a newly commissioned introduction by Allen Wood, who is best known for his first-rate scholarship on Kant and Hegel. Wood’s introduction provides a brief biography of Fichte, compares Kant’s and Fichte’s philosophies of religion, and makes a case for Fichte’s importance in the history of modern and contemporary philosophy. Wood also explains the concept of volition in Fichte’s work and his “synthetic method,” both of which stake out new philosophical territory for post-Kantian idealism. Fichte conceives of self-determination in terms of the unity of the agent, but such a unity can only be achieved by relating the moral motive of respect to empirical impulses. By envisioning a life whose projects are all informed by an overarching moral vocation, Fichte relates morality and happiness in a way that challenges Kant’s sharp distinction between these two kinds of goodness and that anticipates themes in Fichte’s later work. In addition, Fichte’s synthetic method extends Kant’s claim that metaphysical speculation leads to a conflict of reason with itself that must be resolved. Fichte adopts this as a more general argument strategy whereby immediately certain propositions, such as consciousness is of one’s own activity, lead to seemingly contradictory propositions that are synthesized by a new concept. Wood does a good job of explaining these ideas clearly and concisely. Although he is a bit hyperbolic — e.g., “Fichte is the key to the entire tradition of modern continental philosophy” (xxvii) — Wood makes a strong case for Fichte’s philosophical importance.

Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation is Fichte’s first published book. Kant himself encouraged Fichte to publish it, and Kant recommended it to his own publisher. When the book appeared anonymously in 1792, many people thought that Kant had written it. Subsequently, Kant wrote a public letter identifying Fichte as the author, and Fichte became widely known as the next great Kantian philosopher. On the strength of this work, Fichte was appointed chair of philosophy at the University of Jena in 1794, where he would develop his own philosophy, the Wissenschaftslehre, and write a series of books that are only now being fully appreciated in the English-speaking world.

It is understandable that the Attempt was thought to have been written by Kant, given how closely Fichte follows Kant’s approach to ethics, theology, and religion. In the second Critique, Kant had demonstrated that we are justified in believing in God and immortality. Although we ought to do what is right simply because it is right (the supreme good), our practical lives make sense only if happiness is allotted to people in proportion to their virtue (the highest good). Virtue and happiness are inescapable for us as ends because of our rational and sensible natures. For our practical lives to make sense, these two ends must converge. In this life, however, people may benefit from acting wrongly and good people may suffer. Therefore, we are committed to a rationally justified faith that God apportions happiness in proportion to virtue and that we have eternal lives in which we can strive, endlessly, for moral perfection.

For both Kant and Fichte, religion extends beyond these theological propositions and concerns our existence as embodied but rationally constrained agents. In other words, religious beliefs must be consistent with morality, must further right action, and must resolve tensions between our pure moral obligations and the desires we have as natural beings. But it is important to make a distinction between pure rational religion and revealed religion. According to Fichte, pure rational religion is simply a way of viewing the moral law of which we are immediately aware; it concerns God in us. We have an immediate sense of moral constraint — Kant’s fact of reason — and because of that we are committed to assuming in our practical lives that we are responsible agents. Insofar as we view our consciousness of the moral law as a proclamation from God, we have a kind of natural religion that all rational agents must have. Revealed religion is more problematic, however, because it is committed to the idea that God makes himself known to us through the senses. In Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation, Fichte addresses whether and what kind of revealed religion is consistent with Kantian principles, and he concludes that there is room for revealed religion in the critical philosophy, insofar as revelation promotes right action in some people.

After establishing that revelation is possible, provided that any such pronouncement is consistent with the moral law, Fichte argues that a belief in revelation is warranted based on our commitment to the highest good. Drawing on Kant, Fichte makes an important distinction between what he calls the higher and the lower faculties of desire. Only rational beings have a higher faculty of desire, through which they are able to act purely for the sake of the moral law. Duty becomes the object of the will, and duty is self-legislated as the end for the person’s willing. By contrast, the lower faculty of desire has its object given to it through sensibility. As human beings, we sometimes act in order to satisfy such given inclinations. Revealed religion helps to check the lower faculty of desire. It can assist in our striving for moral perfection because it can motivate us to overcome our inclinations and act rightly. Thus revealed religion is distinct from pure rational religion in that the former is needed, and thus is practically justified, only in an empirical sense. Its usefulness depends on whether revelation helps a person to overcome the temptation to act contrary to the moral law.

We arrive at rational religion because our belief in the highest good also demands belief in the existence of God. The moral law is equivalent to a divine command. Religion follows from ethics. By contrast, revealed religion is based on nothing more than a wish that a seeming revelation comes from God. Insofar as that wish has a moral purpose — namely, determination by the higher faculty of desire — Fichte claims that it is justified, although only in a practical and not a theoretical sense. People who are morally weak may be brought to act rightly by religious instruction. Revealed religion may prompt them to reflect on their ethical duties and may motivate them to act rightly, driven by reverence for God as a holy being. Revelations may include such things as moral examples and parables, which demonstrate what makes just actions praiseworthy and what makes unjust actions despicable. In this sense, ethics follows from religion.

Fichte is very clear that the ends do not justify the means. Religion should not motivate people through fear of hell or a desire for heaven. This would undermine morality because the person would not be acting for the sake of duty. Instead, the person must respect God’s command as an end in itself, because it is commanded by a holy being. Respect for God’s command simply amounts to respect for the moral law. Revealed religion also should not compel actions that are contrary to ethics, such as demanding burnt offerings to God. This presupposes that God has desires to be satisfied, and that he can be motivated by emotion. And religion should not use deceit in order to shape people’s behavior. Every supposed revelation, its form and its content, must be tested against the moral law.

One ironic implication of Fichte’s approach is that the goal of revealed religion is its own abolition, or at least its own obsolescence. Although rational beings must commit themselves to a belief in God and immortality, since both are necessary in order to accomplish the highest good, revealed religion is only necessary, and indeed is only justified, for those who need it in order to overcome the pull of inclinations. The more successful revealed religion is, the more people learn to do what is right, and the less they need revelation. Fichte acknowledges that revealed religion is unnecessary and will have no purchase on people who are either very good or very bad. Revelations need not speak to the former and cannot speak to the latter. Religiously informed, morally praiseworthy actions must be motivated by respect for God’s holiness, and a truly wicked person could only be motivated by rewards and punishments.

In the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, Kant discovers the moral law that governs the actions of all rational beings. In the Critique of Practical Reason, Kant shows that imperfectly rational beings — that is, beings who are constrained by the moral law but desire happiness — also must have practical faith in God and immortality. In Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation, Fichte shows that imperfectly rational beings who are struggling to act rightly are justified in believing in revealed religion insofar as it helps them to achieve moral ends. The three books move from more to less abstract characterizations of the human agent, considering the person finally as an embodied being who is subject to temptation.

For Kant and Fichte, practical philosophy, like all philosophy, must be a priori. In the Attempt, Fichte goes to great pains to claim that his analysis of revealed religion does not depend on experience for its truth. To be sure, he justifies revealed religion against the a priori claims of Kantian ethics; the latter remains the only standard. And he states explicitly that revelations could never justify belief in the existence of God as their cause. Like Kant, Fichte denies that such dialectical arguments could ever establish metaphysical claims. However, it is one thing to explain how revealed religion could be possible and yet another to claim that our belief in revelation is justified, even if only in a practical sense, based on our wish for such a thing and our need for moral motivation. Such a pragmatic approach, although its ultimate aim is to encourage acting for the sake of duty, seems to be in tension with the stricter limits that Kant places on religion. During his Jena period, Fichte insists that his philosophy follows the spirit of Kant’s philosophy, if not the letter. In Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation, however, the opposite seems to be the case: he follows the letter of Kant’s philosophy in justifying religious belief on moral grounds, but does not follow the critical spirit — the refusal of speculative metaphysics, the appeal to pure practical reason in justifying faith, and the distinction between what is justified a priori and what is empirically useful.

To be sure, Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation is an important addition to the spate of recent Fichte translations. But there are reasons why the book was originally thought to have been written by Kant himself. With the exception of Fichte’s theory of volition and his appropriation of Kant’s synthetic method, the book is nothing but an extension of Kant’s thought; Fichte’s distinctive voice is largely absent. It is not until the Jena period that Fichte develops his own brand of idealism, especially in The Science of Knowledge (Wissenschaftslehre) (1794), Foundations of Transcendental Philosophy (Wissenschaftslehre) nova methodo (1796/99), Foundations of Natural Right (1796/97), and The System of Ethics (1798), all of which have recently been translated into English. It is in these books, after Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation, that Fichte espouses the ideas for which he is best known: an absolutely free act gives rise to the I, which posits itself in opposition to a Not-I; the thing in itself is philosophically unnecessary because, when we represent it as a cause of sensations, it becomes an object for consciousness and ceases to be a thing in itself; I engage in an endless striving to synthesize the subject and the object, or to bring the external world in conformity with what reason requires of it; I exist as a rights-bearing subject only in relation to other subjects that summon me to self-consciousness — all of these ideas have recently generated enthusiasm among philosophers, and rightly so. Allen Wood mentions these positions late in the introduction to make a case for Fichte’s resonance in the work of Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Heidegger, Sartre, Habermas, and others, but none of these ideas — not the Ich and Nicht-Ich, not the Ding an sich, not Streben or the Aufforderung — appear in Fichte’s first published book. Cambridge’s Attempt at a Critique of All Revelation is a good translation with an excellent introduction, but it is one of Fichte’s less original efforts. The book demonstrates Fichte’s close intellectual relationship to Kant and sets up Fichte’s later work, but because of this, the Attempt is primarily of historical rather than philosophical significance.