Augustine's Intellectual Conversion: The Journey from Platonism to Christianity

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Brian Dobell, Augustine's Intellectual Conversion: The Journey from Platonism to Christianity, Cambridge University Press, 2009, 250pp., $82.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521513395.

Reviewed by Thomas Williams, University of South Florida


Augustine tells us quite clearly in the Confessions that when, under the influence of Bishop Ambrose and the "books of the Platonists," he began to take Christianity seriously, he did not immediately get his Christology right:

I regarded my Lord Christ as a man of surpassing wisdom whom no one else could equal… . I did recognize in Christ a complete human being -- not merely a human body, or a soul with a body but no mind -- but I thought that this human being was to be preferred to others, not as the Person of Truth, but because of some great excellence of his human nature and his more complete participation in wisdom… . I must admit that it was only some time later that I learned how Catholic truth is distinguished from Photinian falsity: the Word was made flesh.[1]

But how much later? The almost irresistible suggestion of Augustine's narrative in Book 7 of the Confessions is that his grasp on Catholic truth was secure by the time of the decisive event in that Milanese garden, an intellectual conversion in Book 7 that was complete in time for the volitional conversion in Book 8. In Augustine's Intellectual Conversion: The Journey from Platonism to Christianity, Brian Dobell argues that we should resist this suggestion; it was not until around 395, eight years after Augustine's baptism, that Augustine learned to distinguish Catholic truth from Photinian falsity.

This is not to say that Augustine's narrative in Book 7 is dishonest; it is simply compressed. Dobell writes:

I am not arguing, and I certainly do not believe, that the narrator of the Confessions is lying to us when he describes the particulars of his conversion to Christianity. I emphatically reject the notion that he is trying to pull the wool over our eyes, making it seem as if he had clarified the distinction between the Catholic and Photinian Christologies at the time of his conversion in 386 when in fact he had done no such thing. Of course, he is highly selective in his presentation of such details as dates and times, and this may at times annoy his readers as the machinations of an obscurantist (witness, for example, the care with which he avoids identifying the authors or contents of the 'books of the Platonists'). But this is no indication of duplicity. (25-26)

On the contrary, Dobell argues, when we look more carefully at what Augustine writes in the latter half of Book 7 and compare it with his early writings, Augustine turns out to be a more reliable narrator than many people have thought. True, if we insist on reading Augustine's narrative as a "play-by-play account of Augustine's intellectual development in the summer of 386," we will run up against insuperable obstacles; but we can resolve this problem by "regard[ing] the narrative as the story of Augustine's intellectual development from 386 to c. 395" (26).

Dobell presents his evidence for this claim in two parts, taking his cue from the two paths to salvation that Augustine describes in his early writings. In Part I Dobell examines the "way of authority," which involves imitating the example of Christ, understood (Dobell argues) in terms of Photinian Christology; in Part II he examines the "way of reason," which corresponds to the "Platonic ascents" of Confessions 7.10.16 and 7.17.23, a method Augustine was working out as late as 391. Augustine would not reject either Photinian Christology or the method of ascent until around 395, Dobell argues, which means that Confessions 7.9.13-7.21.27 must describe Augustine's intellectual development from 386 to 395, not merely in the summer of 386.

Dobell's discussion shows an admirable knowledge of Augustine's earlier writings, and his discussion of the "way of reason" and the method of ascent in Part II is very valuable and deserves a wide readership. In dealing with Christology in Part I, however, Dobell's footing seems much less sure. He does not merely argue that Augustine's early Christology lacked the precision and clarity of his more mature works -- scholars more or less agree on that fact -- or even that Augustine's Christology was insufficiently robust by the standards of his day -- a harder case to make, but a possible one. (No one, I take it, would regard it as particularly interesting to point out that the Augustine of 386 to 395 expressed his Christology in terms that fell short of complete Chalcedonian precision, since the Council of Chalcedon did not meet until 451.) But Dobell argues for the much stronger claim that the early Augustine's Christology was positively Photinian -- that it corresponds to the Christology he repudiates in Confessions 7.19.25. And the evidence just isn't there to sustain such a strong claim.

Dobell's argument goes something like this. When Augustine explains the way of authority in his early works, he says that the many need to be called away from sensible things and turned toward the intelligible world. Since the many are incapable of following the way of reason, there must be a wise man who can serve as an intermediary between their foolishness and the divine wisdom. By his virginal conception and miraculous works, this wise man would capture the attention of the many, who would be able to attain salvation by imitating his exceptional virtue and following his "example of spurning temporal things in order to attain immortality" (Confessions 7.9.15). This description of the work of Christ, Dobell argues, is characteristic of Augustine's early works; it is also how Augustine described the Photinian Christ of his own early Christological confusion. It is therefore reasonable, Dobell concludes, to see Augustine as a Photinian in his early works.

Dobell acknowledges that "There are a few passages from Cassiciacum that are all too easily, and in my view erroneously, taken as evidence that Augustine was already clear on the difference between 'Catholic truth' and 'the falsity of Photinus' in his earliest writings" (70). Why is it erroneous to take them in this way? Dobell's arguments are quick and unsatisfying. For example, Augustine has Licentius say at De ordine 1.10.29 that Christ is God and that Christ was sent to us by the Father. (I note in passing that even if this passage is susceptible of non-Chalcedonian readings, it doesn't lend itself to a Photinian reading. Photinus was an adoptionist: for him, Christ is not sent by the Father.) That need not mean, Dobell argues, that Augustine holds that Jesus of Nazareth is God -- for why should we assume that he identifies Christ with Jesus of Nazareth? To which one can only answer: why on earth wouldn't we make that assumption? What else is the "sending" of Christ, to which Licentius twice refers, but the Incarnation? Dobell says that this passage is consistent with Augustine's identification in Contra Academicos of Christ with the divine Intellect, "whose authority has been sent by the Father down to a human body" (71). I take it that we are being invited to understand 'Christ' as referring only to the divine Intellect and not the human nature of Jesus; but the text of Contra Academicos gives us no reason at all to Nestorianize Augustine in this way -- not least because, contrary to what Dobell says, Contra Academicos 3.19.42-3.20.43 does not in fact identify Christ with the divine Intellect.[2]

This point requires a more careful formulation. I don't mean to deny that when Augustine speaks of the divine Intellect in Contra Academicos, he is talking about the Second Person of the Trinity. But for Dobell's argument to work, he needs Augustine to use the name 'Christ' to refer to the Divine Word but not Jesus of Nazareth. And there is just no indication in this passage that Augustine restricts the reference of 'Christ' in this way. Moreover, he says that the divine Intellect "stooped and submitted" (declinaret atque submitteret) to a human body, thereby allowing rational souls to be inspired not only by his (cuius) precepts but also by his deeds. Grammatically speaking, the cuius could refer to the human body, but that clearly can't be what Augustine means. He's speaking of the deeds of the (incarnate) divine Intellect. This may not be Chalcedonian Christology 65 years before Chalcedon, but it sounds entirely orthodox by the standards of the time. After all, Augustine is recognizing "this human being … as the Person of Truth," the divine Intellect; and that is how he characterizes the correct, non-Photinian Christology in the passage from Confessions 7.9.15 with which we began.

Dobell also acknowledges that the early Augustine frequently uses homo assumptus language in speaking about Christ. Indeed, in a very informative footnote (51 n. 118) Dobell lists more than twenty references in Augustine during his supposedly Photinian period to God's (or the Word's) "taking up" (suscipere) or "assuming" (assumere) a body or a human being as a whole. Such language is consistent with the way Ambrose, an expressly anti-Photinian writer, spoke about Christ. But Dobell cautions us that we should not conclude "that Augustine's early Christology is orthodox simply because the expressions he uses to describe the Incarnation have an orthodox pedigree" (73). We cannot assume, he argues, that Augustine understood that language in a fully orthodox way, because "Confessions 7.19.25 indicates that there had been a time when Augustine understood homo assumptus in the sense of 'a man of outstanding wisdom' rather than as 'the very person of Truth'" (73). But that's simply not true: Augustine's explanation of "Photinian falsity" does not use the expression homo assumptus or anything remotely like it.[3] And if we reject Dobell's unwarranted claim that Augustine once understood homo assumptus along Photinian lines, we are left with no reason not to read the twenty-something passages from the period 386-395 in which Augustine uses such language as meaning what Ambrose and earlier Christian writers of unquestioned orthodoxy had meant.

Similarly, when Dobell says, "We find no clear statements of Christ's union with Wisdom, the eternal Word of God, until Augustine's commentary on Paul's letter to the Galatians (394/5)" (80), this can be true only if we refuse to read the many instances of homo assumptus language in Augustine's earlier writings in an orthodox sense. Dobell says that all of Augustine's "early descriptions of the homo assumptus seem wholly consistent with adoptionism" (79), but what adoptionist would say that "so great a God deigned to assume and bear a body of our sort" (De ordine 2.5.16, 386), or that "in a wondrous and indescribable mystery, the supreme Wisdom of God deigned to take up this affliction [consequent upon sin] when he took up a human being who was without sin, yet subject to the conditions that befit sinners (sine peccato, non sine peccatoris condicione)" (De musica 6.4.7, 388/390), or that "our Lord deigned to assume the cloud of our flesh" (De Genesi contra Manichaeos 2.5.6, 388/390)? In adoptionism, God in no way "deigns" to take upon himself (assumere/suscipere) the human condition. Nearly all of Augustine's uses of homo assumptus language in this period imply a much more intimate relationship between the divine Word and Jesus of Nazareth than an adoptionist could affirm, even if Augustine's formulation has not yet reached the proto-Chalcedonian precision that he would achieve by 411.

Dobell is more successful in arguing for developments in Augustine's soteriology and for the claim that Augustine gradually abandoned the belief that human beings can attain perfection in this life.[4] But these arguments do not lend support to the idea that Augustine held a Photinian Christology after 386, as Dobell thinks they do (100). For one thing, although Augustine in Confessions 7.19.25 ascribes to Photinus both Christological and soteriological views, when he identifies the point in which Catholic truth differs from Photinian falsity, he specifies only the Christological point: the Word was made flesh. He does not say that Photinus erred in treating Christ as a man to be imitated -- as Augustine himself will continue to do -- but that he erred in treating Christ as no more than a man (however worthy of imitation). And for another, it is far from obvious that even a proto-Chalcedonian Christology requires a "transactional" account of the Atonement, such as a theory of substitution or the ransom theory, as Dobell seems to think (98-99). Why couldn't one hold a Chalcedonian Christology and yet emphasize, even exclusively, the exemplary function of Christ's life and passion, rather than any intrinsic transactional efficacy of the Cross? And with respect to Augustine's understanding of the need for grace and of the impossibility of attaining perfection in this life, Augustine tells us himself in the Retractationes that he didn't understand Paul properly (by his later lights) on these matters until 396, so Dobell's developmental account breaks no new ground.[5]

It is unfortunate that Dobell should devote the first half of his book to Christological matters; when he turns in the second half to the way of reason and the method of ascent, he is on much firmer ground. I would urge readers who are interested in the development of Augustine's views or in his understanding of the Platonic ascent to go right to Part II, where they will find much that is interesting and illuminating.[6]

[1] Confessions 7.19.25. Translations throughout are my own.

[2] And when Augustine says in 3.20.43 that he will by no means withdraw from the authority of Christ, he has to mean the authority of Jesus of Nazareth, not the authority of the preexistent divine Intellect, because the discarnate Word is (by Dobell's own argument) the object not of the way of authority, but of the way of reason.

[3] There is no form of assumere anywhere in Book 7, and the only form of suscipere to be found in that Book is not used in a Christological context.

[4] The distinction between Christology, the doctrine of the Person of Christ, and soteriology, the doctrine of the work of Christ, is traditional, though admittedly artificial. I use it in this review merely for the sake of convenience.

[5] That Augustine shows no similar dissatisfaction in the Retractationes with the Christology of his early works is hard to reconcile with Dobell's finding of Photinianism throughout those works -- or at least hard to reconcile with that finding if, like Dobell, we wish to acquit Augustine of any sort of "cover-up" of his early Christological errors.

[6] I am grateful to Erik Kenyon for his generous help with this review.