Autonomy After Auschwitz: Adorno, German Idealism, and Modernity

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Martin Shuster, Autonomy After Auschwitz: Adorno, German Idealism, and Modernity, University of Chicago Press, 2014, 201pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226155487.

Reviewed by Owen Hulatt, University of York


The ideal of autonomy -- the refusal to acquiesce to any maxim, demand, outcome, or line of argument that one has not endorsed, or could not endorse, for oneself -- combines immediate appeal with equally immediate difficulty. It poses what appear to be intense, possibly unreasonable demands on one's agency, epistemic position, and moral psychology. But, by the same token, it is -- at least in modernity -- an utterly essential part of what we take ourselves to be, and part of the normative bedrock we appeal to in order to better our lot. The ills of modernity characteristically focus around problems of power and coercion, whether these be crudely expressed (in state coercion, say) or are more elusively played out (in the ability of ideology, 'reification', and other putative pathologies of reason to undermine our ability to truly exercise free choice). And it is our desire for autonomy, our struggle for freedom, that arguably underwrites our struggle against these features of modernity.

Martin Shuster's book argues against this picture that the ideal of autonomy is not only a bulwark against the ills of modernity but, in its traditional form at least, also responsible for them. Our understanding of autonomy requires revision; and this is, by implication, a simultaneously political, ethical, and epistemic task.

To begin getting an argument like this off the ground one needs to be able to situate facts about reason and society, and about social and conceptual ailments, in some grander encompassing narrative. Perhaps the grandest post-metaphysical narrative available is that given in Dialectic of Enlightenment, in which Theodor Adorno and Max Horkheimer offer an account of the intertwined genealogy of rationality and of social forms, and of the deformations and miscalibrations that each inherited from and reinforced in the other. This account was in part substantially influenced by the anthropological work of Marcel Mauss, Henri Hubert, Roger Caillois, and James Frazer (more on which shortly), but its chief novelty was the claim that these distant beginnings of reason (in magic; in ritual) inaugurated pathologies in the organization of reason, which carried through all the way up to the work of Kant and Hegel. (Indeed, Kant and Hegel were seen as exhibiting these pathologies at or near their presently highest levels of development). These pathologies included the identification of objects with the concepts that ranged over them; a reduction of rationality to mere instrumental means-end reasoning; and an intense intolerance of conceptual schemas for those 'non-identical' phenomena that failed to fit seamlessly into them. As these pathologies of reason were realized both in pure thought and in practical reasoning, these pathologies were part of the enabling conditions not only for philosophical antinomies but also -- it was argued -- the Holocaust, in which this intolerance of alterity was given murderous expression. This is precisely the 'dialectic of enlightenment': ostensibly 'enlightened' thought was in fact a more fully realized expression of the primeval, self-preserving and deformed kind of reason found in myth.

In Chapter 1, Shuster revisits this dialectic from a novel angle, arguing that the Kantian conception of autonomy is the 'motor' of it. (Shuster is not committing an egregious anachronism here -- it is the kind of understanding of one's own autonomy that goes on to find its clearest expression in Kant, which stands at the centre of the historical generation of these pathologies, and which substantially drives their development from primeval through to present times). As Shuster himself notes, Dialectic of Enlightenment has been both maligned and celebrated for the wrong reasons. The extent to which it represents an intervention into Kantian and post-Kantian arguments has perhaps only recently started to fully come into focus in the scholarship, and Shuster's account is a significant contribution on this score.

Shuster notes that the Kantian conception of autonomy requires that I be able to fully endorse only those laws and maxims that I could treat as having endorsed and legislated for myself. The problem is that Kant also posits concepts and intuitions as having a cognitive and ontological gap between them, which cannot be closed. (As Shuster shows, this is Adorno's position also). And so, as I attempt to arrive at a full understanding of the factors involved in my actions -- a full understanding of which is required in order to be confident I am autonomously endorsing the actions I take myself to be endorsing -- I come up against a firm limit; namely, the refusal of the object in itself to be fully known. This refusal exhibits itself in the dialectical instability that results when we attempt to cognize or describe the noumenal realm (p. 26). As a consequence, we are required to instead self-reflexively ground reason. This serves to drive us into the dialectic of enlightenment, it is claimed, as reason is required, just in order to realize autonomy, to screen off those objects outside of itself that prove resistant to it.

Shuster does note that he is here addressing 'one strand' of Dialectic of Enlightenment -- namely, the arguments concerning autonomy -- but nonetheless even within this strand there is some important loss of content in his rendering of it. Shuster notes in passing that the Kantian account applies only to 'constructed ideas of reason' (p. 30), whereas Adorno and Horkheimer's account applies to 'all human reasoning and cognition'. This difference is not a small one, and the material that allows Adorno and Horkheimer to make the global claim about all human reasoning and cognition is drawn from the work of authors outside of the Kantian tradition (the anthropological material I alluded to earlier, in particular that of Frazer and Caillois). As a consequence, the idea that the Dialectic is centrally or mainly a response to Kant, even within this strand of argument about autonomy, is perhaps not quite right. But outside of this scope issue, Shuster's work is careful, original and insightful here.

This first chapter, then, serves as an identification of the core ill of modern ideas of autonomy. The reduction to self-reflexivity seems to entail an exclusion of objects, a failure of responsivity to one's being grounded in a broader context of goods, and objective features. The second chapter considers whether there might be a response from within Kant's own work to this problematic feature of autonomy. Shuster's work here is careful and sustained, tracing Kant's revision and amendment of his account of his rational theology across the Groundwork and the three Critiques. The motivating problem was identified earlier -- autonomous assent requires knowledge of the structural context and upshot of our actions. Given the noumenal block, this need for knowledge is apparently unsatisfiable -- our actions and maxims might be embedded in a causal system that in fact runs counter to our desired outcomes and values. What is required is some extra-phenomenal guarantee that the world is amenable to moral action. It is only in the third Critique, it is argued, that a non-circular solution to this problem is delivered.

Shuster endorses the account hit upon in the third Critique as the best articulation of and solution to Kant's problem. Here, we see that Kant's 'rational theology' is directly entailed, in a non-circular fashion, by his account of autonomy. Kant takes it that to autonomously will our maxims requires assurance that the world within which these maxims are nested is, as a unity, tending towards the realization of moral aims with which we would concur -- the highest good. (It cannot be that our maxims are nested within an a- or im-moral system). We also require a supreme ground to underpin and organize our maxims into a purposive, unified system. In order not to split our ways of justifying actions (according to their moral worth; their unity within a system of maxims), Kant needs to show that the highest good and this supreme ground are the same thing (p. 63). As a consequence, in the third Critique Kant makes use of reflective judgement in order to posit humanity as the final end of creation, and God as the 'moral author of the world' (p. 69). As that moral author -- who both creates the world, and creates it along moral lines -- God provides the supersensible affirmation of both the organization of maxims within a unified system, and the identification of the highest good with moral activity within that system. This provides a 'rejoinder' to Adorno and Horkheimer because autonomy is shown to entail intrinsically the positing of supersensible, conceptually uncapturable existents. As such, autonomy does not, on the Kantian picture, aim towards complete subsumption, and a withdrawal into mere self-reflexivity, but rather internally generates its own limits. While this suggests that Adorno and Horkheimer's critique of Kant speaks past him to an extent, Shuster sees Kant's rational theology as grounded in exotic metaphysical commitments that Adorno would take to be untenable. And so the remainder of the book is given over to finding a 'third way' for autonomy that is not solipsistically self-reflexive, nor reliant on arguably unsustainable metaphysical models; 'neither to the Charybdis of the dialectic of Enlightenment not to the Scylla of the highest good' (p. 70).

This third way, developed in Chapter 3, draws mainly on Adorno's account of the 'addendum' in conjunction with some of Cavell's work on 'forms of life'. For Adorno, action does not always or even mainly come into being through the deliberative formation and execution of intentions. He lays stress on the non-rationalized (which is not to say, non-rationalizable) role of the 'addendum'. This 'addendum', external to reason, forms a kind of somatic stimulus that prompts the agent into actions that were not previously open to him. It is a steep interpretive task to cash out Adorno's idea of the addendum without getting bogged down in Adorno's cursorily outlined account of the body/mind relationship, and without rendering Adorno's account simply as a form of irrationalism. Shuster's work avoids both of these pitfalls in an exemplary fashion, and gives an original and largely reconstructive account in negotiation with the work of Anscombe, Vogler, McDowell and Brandom, amongst others. On this picture, action derives from one's full situation, and the affordances to action that that situation exhibits. The 'addenda' are understood to be ways of altering, or making newly salient, those affordances, and eliciting novel forms of action. It is through these affordances that the world 'solicits and draws out of us' certain actions (p. 84). The mechanics of this 'solicitation' are in part developed through Cavell's conception of a 'form of life', in which socio-historical and somatic aspects of experience jointly come to determine our manner of being and acting, and the affordances and saliences we stand in relation to. The action of addenda -- together with other kinds of 'jolts' to our established pattern of experience -- will serve to re-order the salient causal factors in our lived experience, and entail different ways in which the world will solicit actions from us.

The precise way in which this constitutes a 'third way' of conceiving autonomy would benefit from being made more explicit -- the reader is tasked with drawing some of the connections and entailments herself. All the same, Shuster successfully shows that for Adorno autonomy is a situated business, embedded in the socio-historically contingent and revisable affordances with which one is presented. Accordingly, morality for Adorno is no longer simply about choice but about 'worldview' -- and, by extension, about the lineaments of the lived world in which that worldview is formed. A form of life is socio-historically malleable and plastic. Being malleable in this way, these forms of life are also vulnerable - it could be the case that the affordances for free action, and our responsivity to them, could be deformed or closed off. And this is precisely the main charge that Shuster levels against Kant: the socio-historical features and enabling conditions of agency that Kant admits in his formula of humanity run deeper than Kant suggests. And this -- so the claim goes -- opens the possibility that autonomy, happiness, and proper responsivity might be closed off, if these socio-historical enabling conditions became suitably deformed. It is just this, of course, that Adorno takes to be the way in which things increasingly stand.

This brings us to the closing chapter, addressed to the work of Hegel. The concerns just elaborated -- concerning the socio-historical determination of affordances for action -- imply that reflection is required in order to understand our situation, and the capacity for autonomy embedded in it. Shuster takes it that Hegel is the 'philosopher of reflection par excellence' (p. 133) and so is of use in augmenting the account that Shuster has delivered in Chapter 3. This is for the most part intended to bolster the Cavellian account of a 'form of life', but it seems to have a less central role in the overarching dialectic (indeed, at points the motivating question fades from view).

By the close, Shuster claims to have 'reconstructed a formal model for understanding ourselves as agents' (p. 174). This reconstructed model replaces the traditional model of ethical action -- in which intention and choice are paramount -- with a jointly Adornian and Cavellian one, in which moral action is solicited from within interpersonally situated forms of life and experience. Shuster has developed this model with care, and makes careful interventions into the reading of some major figures in developing it. Throughout, the claims advanced are convincingly and helpfully situated in relation to recent scholarship within both Anglophone philosophy and the European post-Kantian tradition. As the author himself notes, this reconstructed position stands in need of further elaboration. But Shuster does more than enough to suggest that this would be a task worth undertaking.