Avicenna and His Legacy: A Golden Age of Science and Philosophy

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Y. Tzvi Langermann (ed.), Avicenna and His Legacy: A Golden Age of Science and Philosophy, Brepols, 2009, 381pp., $116.00 (hbk), ISBN 9782503527536.

Reviewed by Jon McGinnis, University of Missouri-St. Louis


One strand of philosophy done in the medieval Islamic world -- a tradition known as falsafa -- had its source in the philosophical system of Aristotle and the Graeco-Arabic commentary tradition that grew up around his works. Representatives of this tradition included al-Kindī, al-Fārābī, Avicenna, and Averroes, all of whom belong to what has been called the classical period of Arabic philosophy. While these figures may not be common household names, they are not completely unknown either, and over the past thirty years our knowledge of them and their thought has been steadily increasing. In contrast, our knowledge of the philosophers and philosophical thought of the post-classical Islamic intellectual tradition is deplorably small. (How many philosophers writing in either Arabic or Persian after Averroes (d. 1198) can you name?)

Avicenna and His Legacy: A Golden Age of Science and Philosophy is the first extended attempt to fill in this gap in our knowledge of the history of philosophy. The book's primary emphasis is on the legacy of Avicenna (980-1037) undoubtedly because after Avicenna it is no longer the philosophical system of Aristotle that provided the source for philosophical speculation in the medieval East but the thought of Avicenna. (Here it might also be worth noting that Avicenna and His Legacy focuses exclusively on Avicenna's heritage in the Islamic and Jewish medieval world and not his influence on European Christian thinkers.) Indeed, it is the philosophical legacy of Avicenna as it plays out in the post-classical Islamic east that unifies the near score of diverse essays that make up this book.

It consists of seventeen essays by both upcoming younger scholars and more established researchers; a nice foreword by the editor Tzvi Langermann, which situates and briefly summarizes the theses and themes of those essays; and finally two indices, one for names, the other for works (unfortunately there is no subject index). The book appears to fall into three very broad sections, albeit not delineated as such by the editor: the first nine essays concern Avicenna's influence on individuals, with particular emphases on al-Ghazālī and Ibn Kammūna; the second six treat Avicenna's impact on the development of certain philosophical and scientific subjects, such as issues in logic, theology, medicine, and astronomy; and the final two are dedicated to the place of Avicenna in medieval Jewish thought. With hardly an exception, the essays are good and some are exceptionally so, making the volume a welcome addition for Islamicists and intellectual historians alike.

To help readers get some sense of the content of the collection as a whole, I will list the essays along with a short comment on each. (1) The first broad section, which I identified as treating Avicenna's influence on individuals, begins with Ahmed al-Rahim's "Avicenna's Immediate Disciples: Their Lives and Works," which provides a wonderful snapshot of the first three generations of Avicennans, such as al-Jūzjānī, Bahmanyār, Ibn Zayla and others. Despite the limited amount of primary sources available to us about such figures, al-Rahim has offered a quite informative survey. (2) Frank Griffel's contribution, "Al-Ghazālī 's Cosmology in the Veil Section of his Mishkāt al-Anwār," is a close reading of the final chapter of al-Ghazālī's The Niche of Lights. While it is not always obvious how the essay relates to the Avicennan legacy, the final section makes some very interesting observations concerning al-Ghazālī's opinion about Avicenna (as well as about al-Fārābī).

(3) "The Good, the Bad, and the Ugly of Falsafa: Al-Ghazālī 's Maḍnūn, Tahāfut, and Maqāṣid, with Particular Attention to their Falsafī Treatments of God's Knowledge of Temporal Events" by M. Afifi al-Akiti is a very scholarly work showing al-Ghazālī's relation to Avicenna, with a particular emphasis on al-Ghazālī's so-called restricted writings. In general, al-Akiti argues that al-Ghazālī drew much more heavily on falsafa in his mature writing than has been hitherto appreciated. (4) Binyamin Abrahamov provides a comparison and contrast between the theologian al-Ghazālī and the mystic Ibn ʿArabī in his contribution "Ibn al-ʿArabī's Attitude toward al-Ghazālī." Although the essay is very nicely done, it is not always clear how Avicenna and his legacy fit into the story presented there. (5) Anna Akasoy's "The al-Ghazālī Conspiracy: Reflections on the Inter-Mediterranean Dimension of Islamic Intellectual History" is an interesting historical piece dealing with the exchange of ideas between the eastern and western parts of the Mediterranean, but particularly via émigrés from Andalusia to the East and then eastern responses to the intellectual world of medieval Muslim Spain such as (philosophical) Sufism.

Arguably one of the most outstanding essays in this collection of fine works is (6) Heidrun Eichner's "The Chapter 'On Existence and Non-existence' of Ibn Kammūna's al-Jadīd fī l-Ḥikma: Trends and Sources in an Author's Shaping the Exegetical Tradition of al-Suhrawardī's Ontology," which is an excellent historical and philosophical analysis of the distinction between essence and existence as that distinction appears in a number of post-Avicennan thinkers, and how each of those thinkers influenced the development of those that came after them. (7) Another superb contribution is Lukas Muehlethaler's "Ibn Kammūna (d. 683/1284) on the Argument of the Flying Man in Avicenna's Ishārāt and al-Suhrawardī's Talwīḥāt." This piece offers an excellent philosophical analysis of Avicenna's "flying man" argument using post-Avicennan sources to shed new light on the logical structure of the argument and the status of the premises.

(8) Syamsuddin Arif in his contribution "Al-Āmidī's Reception of Ibn Sīnā: Reading Al-Nūr al-Bāhir fī al-Ḥikam al-Zawāhir" provides a solid historical study of al-Āmidī, his life, works, and a brief comparison of one of his major texts with Avicenna's Shifāʾ. (9) What I identified as the first broad division of Avicenna and His Legacy ends with Nahyan Fancy's "The Virtuous Son of the Rational: A Traditionalist's Response to the Falāsifa," which is a comparison, with an eye to Avicenna, of Ibn Ṭufayl's Ḥayy ibn Yaqẓān and Ibn al-Nafīs' Fāḍil ibn Nāṭiq. Fancy's general thesis is that Ibn al-Nafīs is responding to the philosophers' claim that knowledge of God can be obtained apart from revelation.

The second section of the volume deals with the development of certain philosophical and scientific subjects among post-Avicennan thinkers. It begins with (10) David Burrell's short essay "Existence Deriving from 'the Existent': Mulla Sadri with Ibn Sīnā and Suhrawardī," primarily a translation of excerpts from Mullā Ṣadrā on the subject of existence, which Burrell describes as "in an idiom that will help our contemporaries to grasp the intention of [Mullā Ṣadrā's] inquiry" (p. 249). (11) In "Arabic Logicians on Perfect and Imperfect Syllogisms: A Supplement to Patzig's 'Historical Excursus,'" Robert Wisnovsky, focusing specifically on Aristotle's distinction between perfect and imperfect syllogisms, does a nice job of showing us how both the classical and post-classical Arabic commentary tradition can help us better understand Aristotle's logic. (12) Avicenna's position concerning the thorny issue of God's knowledge of particulars is the subject of Sari Nusseibeh's "Avicenna: Providence and God's Knowledge of Particulars." While there are opposing interpretations of Avicenna on this point, Nusseibeh does treat it fairly, although some reference to post-Avicennan thinkers on this issue would also have been welcome as well as in keeping with the overall theme of the volume.

(13) Leigh Chipman's "Is Medicine an ʿilm? A Preliminary Note on Quṭb al-Dīn al-Shīrāzī's al-Tuḥfa al-saʿdiyya (MS Şehid ʿAli Peşa 2047)" offers a text, translation, and study of the opening lines of Quṭb al-Dīn al-Shīrāzī's commentary on Avicenna's discussion of ṭibb (medicine) from the opening lines of the latter's duly famous Canon of Medicine. While the study is fairly limited in its scope, it is nonetheless quite interesting and informative. (14) While Avicenna's intellectual influence is most frequently seen in areas such as philosophy and theology, he also affected subsequent issues in astronomy, as is witnessed in a treatise by his student and secretary al-Jūzjānī, An Epitome on the manner of the arrangement of the orbs. F. Jamil Ragep, in his contribution "The Khilāṣ kayfiyyat tarkīb al-aflāk of al-Jūzjānī: A Preliminary Description of its Avicennian Themes," provides a very nice summary of al-Jūzjānī's treatise with occasional references to Avicenna as well. (15) Robert Morrison's extremely rich "Falsafa and Astronomy after Avicenna: An Evolving Relationship" nicely complements Ragep's contribution. The essay is an excellent and thorough study of Avicenna's influence on post-Avicennan astronomy in the Islamic East.

The final two essays of Avicenna and His Legacy are dedicated to Avicenna's impact on medieval Jewish thought. (16) "Avicenna's Influence on Jewish Thought: Some Reflections" by Steven Harvey is a solid study that traces the influence of Avicenna through both pre- and post-Maimonidean thinkers and, of course, his influence on Moses Maimonides himself. Finally, (17) Paul Fenton, in "New Light on Maimonidean Writings on Metempsychosis and the Influence of Avicenna," offers up a wonderful historical survey of medieval Jewish treatments of reincarnation, particularly with an emphasis on how the Jewish scholars considered, drew upon, and then extended Avicenna's own refutation of metempsychosis.

Let me again say that with hardly an exception the essays in Avicenna and His Legacy are good and some of them are simply outstanding. Thus, what I say next should not be seen as a complaint but rather as an observation, namely, that for the most part, the authors approach their topics historically rather than philosophically. By this I mean that most frequently they focus on the historical context, developments, and material culture of the Avicennan legacy, rather than on providing close philosophical analyses of arguments. Perhaps, given that research into the post-Avicennan philosophic-theological tradition in the East is still rather nascent, the philological and historical spadework represented in Avicenna and His Legacy is necessarily propaedeutic to a philosophical assessment of the positions and arguments of these latter Muslim (and Jewish) thinkers. Of course there are exceptions to my generalization, and I have singled out both Eichner and Muehlethaler's contributions (and there are others as well) that do in fact tackle the arguments of the philosophers that they treat. Again, I don't intend my comment here as a criticism, although it is something to consider if readers are looking for a philosophy book on Avicenna's legacy in the Islamic East. Hopefully, future intellectual historians and philosophers will take up the impressive historical scholarship contained in this collection in order to extend our knowledge of the philosophical systems of thought alive during the post-classical period of Islamic thought.