Background Practices: Essays on the Understanding of Being

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Hubert L. Dreyfus, Background Practices: Essays on the Understanding of Being, Mark A. Wrathall (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2017, 258pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198796220.

Reviewed by Mark Okrent, Bates College


Hubert Dreyfus died this past April at the age of 87, after a distinguished career in which his ideas and personality influenced several generations of scholars working in a variety of different areas. The publication of this collection of essays, written over a period of more than 20 years and expertly edited by Dreyfus' student and long-time friend and collaborator Mark Wrathall, is thus both timely and greatly appreciated. This is especially the case because of the organizing principle of this anthology, the notion of 'background practices', a concept which is, arguably, Hubert Dreyfus' most important contribution. For it is this idea, that being habituated into a set of background practices is a necessary condition on the intelligibility of people, objects, and institutions, that underlies both Dreyfus' distinctive skeptical evaluations of the possibilities of artificial intelligence and his seminal contributions to Heidegger interpretation.

Characteristically, Dreyfus attributed to the Heidegger of Being and Time the claim articulated briefly above: that an agent skillfully coping with its environment in terms of a set of background practices makes it possible for that agent to understand what is involved in being a person, object, or institution,. And, interestingly, Dreyfus also uses this same conceptual framework as the guiding key for his interpretation of the later Heidegger's work on the history of being, technology, and nihilism, topics that provide the focus for many of the essays in this volume. This attribution to Heidegger of the concept and role of background practices is understandable and to some extent justified by the extent to which interpreting Heidegger as introducing this view in Division 1 of Being and Time has proven to be an exceedingly rich interpretive tool when employed by Dreyfus and his many outstanding students and followers, including John Haugeland, Mark Wrathall, Taylor Carman, Bill Blattner, Sean Kelly, and many others. Nevertheless, it is important to remember that the term 'practice' does not appear prominently in Being and Time itself and that, as Dreyfus himself, following Heidegger, rightly insists, every good interpretation of classic philosophical works requires a strong contribution from the interpreter. Dreyfus' rich and influential reading of Heidegger, early and late, in terms of the role of background practices is an example of this truth.

The decision by the editor to use the title and sub-title of this anthology to link background practices with the understanding of being is especially fortunate in that, for Dreyfus, background practices are important precisely because such practices embody and ground an understanding of what it is for entities to be. And it is one of the most welcome features of the articles reprinted here that, while focused on a variety of different topics, many of them offer a number of overlapping and mutually informative statements of the fundamental aspects of this thesis.

What then is Dreyfus' basic claim regarding background practices? As developed in these articles, the thesis has several distinct constituent parts. First, background 'practices' are practices, in a very particular sense of that perhaps overused word. As Dreyfus articulates this sense of 'practice' in the relatively early (1989) "On the Ordering of Things," a practice is (1) a shared way of coping with people, things and institutions, which thus (2) provides norms for distinguishing appropriate and inappropriate behavior in response to those different kinds of entities, and which (3) is embedded in the normative structure of our tools, institution and language:

Heidegger is interested only in the most general characteristics of our understanding of Being. He notes[1], however, that this understanding is embodied in the tools, language, and institutions of a society and in each person growing up in that society. These shared practices into which we are socialized provide a background understanding of what counts as objects, what counts as human beings, and ultimately what counts as real, on the basis of which we can direct our actions towards particular things and people. [156]

Second, in a move clearly reminiscent of Aristotle's account of the habituation of learners into virtue, Dreyfus holds that individuals are socialized into these practices through a process of guided habituation in which children learn the skills necessary to respond appropriately in various situations according to the norms of their local practices by the responses by adults to the child's behavior in concrete circumstances. At several places, Dreyfus uses the example of differences in child-rearing styles in Japan and the U.S. to illustrate this process. In the Foreward to Carol White's Time and Death, (2005) for example, he puts the point in this way:

The babies, of course, imitate the style of nurturing to which they are exposed. It may at first seem puzzling that the baby successfully picks out the gestures that embody the style of its culture as the ones to imitate, but, of course, such success is inevitable. . . . Starting with a style, various practices will make sense and become dominant and others will either become subordinate or will be ignored altogether. [48]

Third, this process of habituation leads to the learner knowing how to react appropriately according to the norms of the practice, rather than the learner coming to know that some way of acting is in accordance with some principles of right behavior, and fourth, knowing how can never be made fully articulate in terms of a set of determinate beliefs:

The case of child-rearing helps us to see that a cultural style is not something in our minds, but, rather, a disposition to act in certain ways in certain situations. It is not in our beliefs but in our artifacts, our sensibilities, and our bodily skills. And like all skills it is too embodied to be made explicit in terms of rules. [48]

It is this fourth point that informs Dreyfus' use of the locution 'background practices': "Like the illumination in a room, a cultural style normally lets us see things just in so far as we don't see it. That is, like the background in perception, the ground of intelligibility must recede so we can see the figure." [49][2] Finally, it is this set of background practices, embodied in our socially derived bodily skills and dispositions that is the necessary condition of any understanding of what it means for something to be. In a very helpful passage from "Heidegger on the Connection between Nihilism, Technology, Art, and Politics" [1992], Dreyfus sums up (most of) these points:

[Heidegger] introduces the idea that the shared everyday skills, concerns, and practices into which we are socialized provide the conditions necessary for people to make sense of the world and their lives. All intelligibility presupposes something that cannot be fully articulate -- a kind of knowing-how rather than a knowing-that. At the deepest level such knowing is embodied in our social skills rather than in our concepts, beliefs, and values. [177]

It is striking that in these essays, and indeed in his writings in general, Dreyfus tends to present this set of positions as a seamless whole. And, in fact, as Dreyfus develops his position, he makes it clear that there is a kind of coherence among the various aspects of his position concerning the nature and role of background practices, a coherence that makes the overall package both plausible and fruitful. Nevertheless, neither here, nor as far as I know in the remainder of his extensive writings, did Dreyfus ever present an argument that attempts to show that these various claims must go together or that any of them follow from any of the others. And there are contexts in which this tendency to treat, without sufficient argument, all of the aspects of his overall position as a single whole can be problematic. For example, even if knowing how to cope with an environment according to normative social practices is a necessary condition on anything being intelligible to an agent, and this knowing-how need neither consist in nor be caused by an agent knowing that something is the case or following some set of articulate rules, it is not obvious that from these premises it follows that it is impossible to codify this know-how in a set of rules, and Dreyfus offers no argument to show that this does follow. But there are contexts in which Dreyfus both affirms and needs this conclusion. As a phenomenologist, Dreyfus would, of course, have claimed that his acceptance of the connections among his theses regarding the role and nature of background practices does not rest on argument, but rather that this connectedness is displayed by a sensitivity to the phenomena described. But there are still occasions, when a bit more argument might have proved helpful.

These particular papers concern the side of Dreyfus' work that focuses most directly on Heidegger interpretation and the implications of his interpretation of Heidegger for issues in metaphysics, philosophy of science, and (especially in the final seven papers) the development of understandings of being that later Heidegger referred to as the 'history of being'. Dreyfus mobilizes his core set of views concerning background practices in each of these essays in order to support a range of interesting, and controversial, theses.

To take an exemplary instance of the richness of these discussions, in "Heidegger's Hermeneutic Realism" (1991) and the later "How Heidegger Defends the Possibility of a Correspondence Theory of Truth with Respect to the Entities of Natural Science" (2001), Dreyfus attempted to develop a Heideggerian position regarding 'the status of the entities supposedly discovered by natural science' [94] out of materials derived from Being and Time, even though there is relatively little in that work that is directly concerned with that question. The view developed seemingly contains both 'realist' and 'antirealist' elements, but is deeply rooted in Dreyfus' reading of Heidegger in terms of background practices. Since, for Dreyfus' Heidegger, (1) entities are only understandable or encounterable as things that are through a set of practices that recede into the background, but (2) the ontological character of those entities that are revealed by a set of practices is relative to the specific character of the practices that reveal that class of entities, and (3) background practices themselves are variable historically and geographically, it seems to follow that both what is and the ontological character of that which is varies as functions of the practices which reveal those entities. So, it also seems to follow that, for a Dreyfusian, the background practices that reveal the entities uncovered by natural science can have no privilege over entities revealed by other sets of practices, which, of course, is a distinctly antirealist position.

But Dreyfus argues against accepting this apparent conclusion from his own premises, by suggesting a distinction between two ways in which our everyday and scientific research practices might be necessary for an understanding of being. On the one hand, one might think, as is apparently presupposed in the above argument sketch, that the background practices in some way or other constitute the entities that they reveal; on the other hand, one might think that practices give one access to the entities that they uncover. And, if one adopts the second alternative, it then becomes possible to understand how modern scientific research practices allows access to "the functional components of the universe as they are in themselves", [118] without denying that other sets of background practices reveal other realms of beings.

Overall, this book provides, for those unfamiliar with Dreyfus' thought, a useful introduction to his core views regarding the role and nature of background practices, and at the same time offers a handy collection of some of his more important essays for those who are already familiar with his work. It is highly recommended.

[1] It is significant that this ‘noting’ is not footnoted, as it is rooted more in Dreyfus’ overall reading of Being and Time than it is in any particular passage from that text.

[2] This characteristic way in which Dreyfus puts this fourth aspect of his views regarding background practices arguably owes as much to Merleau-Ponty as it does to Heidegger, although Merleau-Ponty is cited only once in these essays.