Badiou and Derrida: Politics, Events and their Time

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Antonio Calcagno, Badiou and Derrida: Politics, Events and their Time, Continuum, 2007, 136pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826496171.

Reviewed by Gabriel Riera, University of Illinois, Chicago


A decade ago, Richard Beardsworth stated in his introduction to Derrida and the Political: "the twenty-first century approaches, and it is clear that our political concepts, and, therefore, the fields in which these concepts are discursively organized, acquire meaning and operate, need to be reinvented".[1] A seism of unheard of proportions has shaken the space of the political, a field whose conceptual system has been elaborated throughout a long history as the effect of a complex and stratified legacy: Greek, Roman, and Judeo-Christian. Yet, ten years on, the reinvention of the category of the political still remains an imperative and unavoidable task. Today our political space appears overdetermined by a set of notions: the crisis of the nation-state, of the concepts of citizenship and sovereignty, the omnipresence of globalization and empire, the dangerous appeal to a permanent state of exception, and finally, the pressing impact of biopolitics. However, instead of providing a useful map with which to orient and to intervene in an active transformation of the political space, this constellation of notions marks a limit, an impasse, and signals a difficulty of orientation for political theories or philosophies that still depend on the sovereign One.

It would be hard therefore not to feel enthusiasm and interest for Badiou and Derrida: Politics, Events and their Time, which brings together two major thinkers for whom the question of the political is the question of our century. Some common features between these two philosophers are evident: for both philosophy is an act of resistance (with all the richness and ambiguity that resonates in this term); they approach the political as a field in which to wage war against the sovereign One. For Derrida, the central question which governs the deconstruction of the political is the question of the One that produces violence and protects itself from the other, while for Alain Badiou, insofar as the One is the result of an operation of counting (the counting-as-one) of multiplicities, it closes off any possibility of thinking the event, that which suddenly comes to the impersonality of Being, that which exceeds Being qua Being and thus demands a process of subjectivation and fidelity to the event's truth. Badiou's ontology, not unlike Derrida's deconstruction of the sign and its radical re-conceptualization of writing, is a war machine against the metaphysics of the One, the only possible way to treat politics, according to Badiou, as one of the four conditions of philosophy. They both subscribe to a "militant political critique without end" [Jacques Derrida, Rogues] of normative theoretical and institutional discourses and practices. For both, Derrida and Badiou, the political cannot be simply conceived as consensus building or as simple management of the economy.

Antonio Calcagno engages in a detailed examination of the relationship between politics and time through the works Derrida and Badiou. This is the first book that brings together the two leading French thinkers, and it does so in view of positing a theory of the relationship of time and politics able to account for both political undecidability (Derrida) and decidability (Badiou). Whether this theory is viable, especially since Badiou is being mobilized to achieve a certain "overcoming" of "the Derridean aporia of the double bind" [2], is a matter of debate. Contemporary philosophy has taught us to pause when coming across a desire to achieve any overcoming too hastily; Heidegger's is the case that comes to mind.

Calcagno's argumentative strategy becomes evident in the structure of the book whose presentation inverts the order of the title: Derrida's deconstruction of the political is presented first, as a necessary stage to be left behind, while Badiou's theory of subjectivation and its implication for conceiving politics are presented afterward, as providing the necessary conceptual grid to move beyond the deconstruction of the political: "I see Badiou's philosophy as deepening the Derridean aporia in that Badiou gives a philosophical account of the singular events that come about through subjective and temporal interventions" [9]. Moreover, according to Calcagno, Badiou provides

a possibility for maintaining the undecidability that comes about in the Derridean double-bind while still maintaining the possibility of events and the subjectivation that ensues from such interventions that are political. In fact, for Badiou, undecidability forces or pushes the subject to make a decisive political intervention. [9]

Many readers familiar with Derrida will have no difficulty in reading this last sentence as a description of what commands each of his singular interventions. One must note, however, that what distinguishes Badiou and Derrida is that while the former follows a deductive method based upon mathematical principles, the latter refrains from operating within the field of theory. This means that the failure to provide for a general theory of subjective intervention should not necessarily be read as a pitfall. In the end, Calcagno's claim according to which "Derrida can be a case of a Badiouan subject" [9] may be much more destabilizing than reassuring.

Some of Calcagno's argumentative gestures are by now familiar in Derrida scholarship. I am thinking in particular of the need felt by some scholars to supplement deconstruction's approach to politics. In this sense, this book adds to a list of very illustrious precursors: Simon Critchley's ethico-levinasian supplementation and Beardsworth's technological supplementation à la Stiegler. Following this model, in the book's introductory chapter, Calcagno supplements what he deems to be deconstruction's pitfall, the aporia of the double bind or undecidability, with Badiou's notion of subjective intervention. However, Calcagno also finds some limitations in Badiou's philosophical approach to politics and, in particular, with his conception of time as subjective intervention. This compels Calcagno to introduce the notion of kairos or "appropriate time" as a way of positing a theory able to explain the relationship between the pre-political and the political proper.

The stakes of the book are high, since in spite of some commonalities between Derrida and Badiou, their thinking cannot be so neatly aligned. Derrida's reflections on politics exceed modernity’s framing of the political, which is arguably not the case with Badiou, for whom Heidegger's proclaimed "end of philosophy" lacks any pertinence. It should be remembered that Badiou declares the "end of the end" in order to reassert the significance of philosophy. Although Calcagno devotes a brief section of Part 3 to highlight the differences between Derrida's and Badiou's ways of positing the relationship between time and politics, there is no account that justifies the bringing together of these two central thinkers, nor the stakes and tensions that are at play in bringing them together. This in no way diminishes the merits of a book whose argumentative strategy is characterized by conceptual depth and clarity in the exposition of a very complex set of concepts.

Part 2, "Derrida and the Democracy to Come," opens, not incidentally, with Derrida's grammatological project, which means that Calcagno is well aware that the deconstruction of the political is already at work in the deconstruction of onto-theology, with which the former maintains a systematic connection. The dismantling of phonologocentrism through a radical conception of writing is a necessary passage in order to understand Derrida's more explicit engagement with the concept of the political and with the series of concepts that are systematically linked together within the space of the dominant ontotheological tradition: democracy to come, friendship, community, citizenship and sovereignty.

Further, the passage through the grammatological moment that inaugurates Derrida's thinking does not simply amount to an archeological operation or conceptual genealogy. Calcagno seeks in this phase of Derrida's thinking the tools that will enable the French philosopher to engage in a deconstruction of the political. This is due to the very structure of the political, to the relationship between the real structure of the political and the graphic understood either as writing in a restricted sense, as arch-writing, or différance. The political space, in its non-dissociable link with the religious, juridical, economic, and military spaces, is both structurally and historically related to the field of writing and its transformations, as Derrida shows in Of Grammatology. This applies chiefly to the political space that constituted itself in relationship to a particular determination of writing conceived as essentially phonetic. If Calcagno delves into this problematic it is because Derrida's way of presenting the link between politics and writing frees up a new way of conceiving temporality: différance. Thus, Calcagno's approach to Derrida's resituating of political conceptuality follows the thread of the "democracy to come" which, by being placed under the rubric of différance, and hence conceived as temporizing, is treated as an "arch-structural" pattern.

Calcagno's exploration of the link between this arch-structure of temporization and politics is crucial for his demonstration that "time structures the undecidable shape that politics is to take" [2-3] in Derrida's thinking. This becomes evident through his analysis of the temporal structure of the promise. Calcagno treats the temporal structure of the promise as a concrete instance of the double-bind that yields undecidability. Moreover, since the "to come" (à venir) of the promise supposes an injunction, it elicits a responsibility. In the end, Derrida's "democracy to come" makes possible "the maximizing of differences, especially individual differences," which entails, not unlike Badiou, a dismantling of forms of identificatory and representational structures of political organization.

Calcagno's final claim is that "democracy-to-come" is a non-originary origin (an arch-structure) or "transcendental" condition that "structures political life and political decision-making in general" and that, moreover, it shows "the inherent undecidability of politics qua political decision-making and political subjectivity" [6]. For Calcagno the Derridean conception of temporization leaves us only with a politics conditioned by undecidability that entails a challenge to "any possibility of political thinking, let alone political discourse" [8]. This is, of course, a debatable conclusion that would certainly demand a pointed discussion on undecidability and its implications for any process of subjectivation, be it ethical or political. But this discussion is imperative to assess what Calcagno deems to be Derrida's insufficiently explored paradox: "Derrida [engages] in decisive political stands that seem to contradict his claim of undecidability" [9]. This important claim, which entails the location of a certain decisionism [40] in Derrida's language, should have been the occasion to engage in a careful analysis of how two philosophers inspired by Cantor's mathematics of infinity deal with the ontological, epistemological, political and ethical implications of this legacy. However, some doubts arise when the force of Derrida's aporia, that is, the force of deconstruction, is assimilated or reduced to a "lapsus between the philosopher of undecidability and the engaged man of decisive political stances" [8]. One cannot but wonder about the sort of unifying theory that is at play here.

If Derridean temporizing, according to Calcagno, ends in the aporia of the double-bind, making it hard to provide us with a general theory of subjective political intervention, in Part 3, "Badiou, Time and Politics," Badiou's notion of subjective intervention allows Calcagno to present a more complete account "for the fidelity to a legacy of events as temporally rupturing" [2]. Badiou's philosophy thus provides a theory with which to think the link between time and politics in terms of a subjective intervention. Calcagno claims that in Badiou the "notion of intervention launches the event" [7]; this is a claim that evinces a particular way of stressing Badiou's theory of the event for which intervention is always an after-effect and not the source of the event. Be that as it may, if the intervention launches the event, it produces, on the one hand, a rupture with the fabric of ordinary time and, on the other hand, the making possible of politics. In the end, Calcagno treats Badiou's theory of the event as the condition of possibility of politics, if by this one understands a form of fidelity to the event, a way of thinking through its consequences. Calcagno's discussion of Badiou focuses on Being and Event and Logiques des mondes; his goal is to explain the two key-concepts of Badiou's philosophy, being and event, an understanding which paves the way for Badiou's conception of temporality and the political.

Calcagno isolates the two central theses of Badiou's ontology: there is no One; there is only a multiplicity of multiples composed by multiples which, by an operation called the counting-as-one, becomes a situation and is thus recognized as a multiple, that is, presented. Further, Calcagno refers to two other crucial concepts that structure Badiou's ontology: the void and the event as ultra-One. The void is the being as such of any multiple presentation. Because multiple presentations harbor the void within them, they are always imperiled by it. For Badiou the paradoxes of set theory are evidence of the irreducible inconsistency of Being, which entails that Being cannot be formulated as a totality. Actual infinity is founded on the void, which in turn is in excess of any given situation. Therefore, an event arises as the inconsistency of Being that fractures the consistencies of presentation. The event is thus the expression of the void within the particular situation at hand; it functions as a radical supplement to the indifferent multiplicity of Being. For this reason, up to Logiques des mondes, the event is qualified as the ultra-One. There is no abstract or general situation of the event at all; it is always particular to a given situation. For Badiou, this "localization" of the event is the very principle of its emergence. It also founds what he calls history. For Badiou, to think politics entails giving consistency to an event, to "faithfully" think through this event in its truth. Calcagno seeks to expand Badiou's logic of consistency beyond the restricted political field opened by the event.

Part 4 thus contains Calcagno's personal contribution to what Badiou's commentators have seen as a major conundrum: the intermittent nature of his temporality and the problematic relationship between the "high time" of the event and the "low time" of pre-political every-day life. Calcagno proposes an explanation of the pre-political subjectivity that he places under the heading of kairos, in the sense of an appropriate or strategic time:

To attribute the potential of kairological significance to the pre-political would serve as a possible bridge to the multiple that Badiou claims is included in the situation, which is part and parcel of the event. Ultimately, the kairological extends time from the purely subjective realm to the worldly realm. [104]

Calcagno's attempt to graft elements of a more objectivist ontology onto Badiou's ontology compels him to treat the kairological as pre-subjective. In the end, Calcagno sifts Badiou's ontology through a more pragmatic filter in order to make the relationship between the political and the pre-political more fluid.

Antonio Calcagno has produced a book that will not only be of great interest to scholars of Jacques Derrida and Alain Badiou, but also to those engaged with the ongoing debate on politics in our time. Because of its clarity in exposition, this book is accessible to a broad range of readers from different disciplines in the humanities and most especially to those interested in philosophy.

[1] Richard Beardsworth, Derrida & the Political. London: Routledge, 1996, xii.