Badiou and Theology

Placeholder book cover

Frederiek Depoortere, Badiou and Theology, Continuum, 2009, 158pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780567032621.

Reviewed by Clayton Crockett, University of Central Arkansas



Despite Badiou’s professed atheism, there are a number of ways that his philosophy can be related to theology. The value of Depoortere’s book is that it is not simply a survey but a constructive engagement with Badiou’s thought, centered on his set-theoretic ontology. This value, however, is also a limitation, because Depoortere’s overall engagement is somewhat idiosyncratic and incoherent, as I will discuss below. After an introduction that provides helpful context for reading Badiou in terms of Christian theology, the rest of the book consists of three fascinating but uneven chapters. The body of the book represents an attempt to articulate, justify and defend a proof of God’s existence in both traditional Thomistic and modern set-theoretical terms, over against Badiou’s atheistic interpretation of set-theoretic ontology.

In the introduction, Depoortere defines modernity as “”“>a passion for the new” that has been compromised by the failure of political utopian projects (1). Christianity, particularly as seen through contemporary accounts of Paul by Žižek, Badiou and others, offers “the prospect of a new kind of revolutionary subject” (9). Badiou’s thought is important because it “offers us clues for ‘saving’ the (Christian) passion for the new in our post-revolutionary age” (21). But this passion for the new and this renewed Christian subjectivity are drawn up into a new proof for the existence of God that takes place in very traditional terms. Depoortere argues that the way for theology to take seriously Badiou’s philosophy is to explore its usefulness for clarifying our concept of God, “which no longer has any clearly circumscribed meaning,” so he defaults to the “historical consensus of classical theism” (23-24).

Badiou claims in his book Saint Paul that Paul gives us a new form of universal subjectivity, and this takes the form of an event. Badiou’s master-work, Being and Event, develops a mathematical ontology of being qua being in order to articulate how an event subtracts from being in a way that cannot be strictly formalized. If the event is what offers the promise for a revolutionary subjectivity, why does Badiou and Theology ignore the event in favor of a sustained exposition of Badiou’s set-theoretic ontology? Depoortere intervenes into and upon Badiou’s ontology in order to shift the terms of the debate from a decision for atheism to a decision for theism, and this is a striking and significant intervention. But the idea of the event completely drops out of the purview of Depoortere’s discussion, which is also significant. The majority of this book consists of a constructive philosophical-theological-analytic project: what is new is adopting the perspective of set-theoretic ontology to update Aristotelian and Thomistic arguments for God’s essence and existence. Set theory as elaborated by Cantor replaces Aristotelianism in supplying a philosophical ontology to ground a neo-Thomistic theology. This constructive project is also problematic, however, because it still relies on fundamentally Aristotelian oppositions, mainly that of actual vs. potential, and because it ultimately depends on a leap of faith from the possibility of God as absolutely infinite to the actuality of this absolute infinite’s existence.

Before explaining what is at stake in Depoortere’s intervention, and why I think it is ultimately incoherent, I will briefly survey the three chapters that follow the introduction. Chapter 1, “Faith and the Existence of God,” lays out definitions and “terminological clarifications” that predetermine the encounter with Badiou’s work. Depoortere argues, against many modern humanist understandings, that faith has a supernatural origin and depends on the existence of God to be faith. Depoortere relies strongly on the Summa Theologiae of Aquinas, the statement of Vatican I on Dei Filius, and contemporary Roman Catholic theologians such as Avery Dulles for this conclusion. Depoortere wants to resist the possibility of any faith that does not require belief in the existence of a traditional theistic God, and here he agrees with Badiou: “I want to side with ”SpellE">Badiou and hold on to a strong understanding of both religion and faith, an understanding which implies that neither can be true if God does not exist" (36). Badiou claims that God does not exist, and therefore religion and faith are impossible. Depoortere takes this challenge seriously, sharpening the edge of the either/or, but he offers an alternative argument that God does exist. Depoortere understands the hermeneutical nature of faith, but he says that this circle is a closed circle, and “the only way to escape from this closed circle is to prove the existence of God ”“>without presupposing faith” (38). This attempt to prove the existence of God by means of set theory without presupposing subjective faith is the implicit thesis of the book, and the payoff of theology’s encounter with Badiou.

Chapter 2, “”SpellE">Badiou on Being," carefully and clearly lays out the mathematical basis of set theory that informs Badiou’s Being and Event. This chapter is extremely valuable, because many thinkers concerned with themes of religion and theology avoid the intimidating mathematical formalization that predominates in Badiou’s masterwork. Depoortere gives us an impressive, sensitive and difficult reading of set theory in general, and Badiou’s mathematical ontology in particular. What Depoortere makes clear is that Badiou approaches the limits of philosophical speculation and mathematical formalization and makes a decision: in order to exclude paradoxical sets (sets that are not members of themselves), Badiou rejects the idea of the one that would harmonize these incompatible sets into any consistent multiplicity. Rather, by affirming the multiple as multiple, Badiou’s ontology “is thus the thinking of ‘inconsistent multiplicity’” (64). Inconsistent multiplicity cannot be thought as such but provides the “‘ungraspable horizon of being’” (64). In order to formalize or axiomatize set theory into a consistent mathematical theory, one must rule out the possibility of paradoxical sets. According to Badiou, and affirmed by Depoortere, “this has resulted in a laicization or secularization of the infinite in which there is neither need nor place for God” (65). Why? Because what ultimately exists is being qua being, which is inconsistent multiplicity. In order for something to exist for us, we must subtract from this original multiplicity and count some multiple as one in order to construct a stable situation of knowledge. The procedure by which one “counts as one” is the void or the null set, which makes it possible to suture presentation to what is presented. The void names the original multiplicity of being, and the link that allows one to present what is ultimately unpresentable. Without any overarching one, there can be no God who exists above or beyond the multiplicity in any traditional form.

In order to ‘save’ God, Depoortere reverts back to Cantor’s original presentation of set theory, and his development of the idea of transfinite numbers. Cantor relies on the idea of “well-ordered sets” to suggest that we can count numbers higher than infinity, such as infinity plus one, infinity plus two, etc. (84). The mathematical manipulation of numbers greater than infinity, or transfinite numbers, involves an understanding of numbers as ordinal (ordering, consecutive) rather than as cardinal (that is, as representing some objective real measurement). Then the question arises about the real status of these transfinite numbers: are they actual infinities or just possible infinities? Do they point toward and are they limited by an absolute infinity, or are they just endless? Cantor accepts the axiom of infinity, which “declares that a limit ordinal exists,” or that such transfinite numbers themselves eventually come to an end (88). Badiou, on the other hand, rejects both the axiom of infinity and the continuum hypothesis that is often associated with it. The continuum hypothesis suggests that numbers are really related in a well-ordered hierarchy, but this hypothesis cannot be proven true or false within the context of the standard Zermelo-Fraenken axiomaticization of set theory. So this fundamental undecidability provokes a decision: from Badiou, for the void and against the one as absolute infinity; from Cantor, for the absolutely infinite as actually existing, which according to Depoortere means the mathematical form of a theological re-instantiation of God.

The final chapter, “Theological Evaluation of ”SpellE">Badiou’s Ontology," draws out this distinction between Cantor and Badiou and provides a perspective from which to make such a decision concerning the actually existing infinite. For Cantor, inconsistent multiplicity

comes at the end, so to speak, at the limit of his mathematical endeavors. There, where the count-as-one fails, one bumps into the absolute. For Badiou, in contrast, inconsistency is primary; it is “the nothing that precedes the count-as-one (115).

”NDPRBodyTexT">Inconsistent multiplicity in mathematical terms means the limit of our understanding, for Cantor. Cantor decides for God as the limit of this inconsistent multiplicity based on his assumption that there can be no potential absolutely infinite without it being actual. Badiou cuts off this assumption by beginning with inconsistent multiplicity and claiming that there is no limit. According to Depoortere, there is no mathematical solution to this dispute. Mathematics can think a potentially existing absolute infinity, but “there is no place for an actually existing absolute in mathematics” (118). Depoortere is correct to point out that Badiou’s claim that set theory necessarily excludes the absolute infinite goes too far; it is an interpretation or decision by which Badiou opts for the void as opposed to the absolute infinite. Furthermore, Depoortere discusses an essay by Kenneth Reynhout, which argues that one can read Badiou’s theory of the void in terms of negative theology, where the null set 㼀 is the sign of Badiou’s “hidden God.” But this negative theological understanding of set theory and Badiou is not sufficient for Depoortere’s aims. Depoortere concludes the book with a very condensed argument for a traditional God understood in set theoretical terms as absolutely infinite by referring to a book by Rudy Rucker, Infinity and the Mind. Rucker suggests, by means of the “reflection ”GramE">principle," that there is a positive connection between transfinite numbers and the absolute infinite. This connection provides Depoortere an opening to declare that we can preserve the traditional knowability and unknowability of God in modern mathematical terms, and therefore “it remains possible to break out of the closed circle of faith presupposing faith” (126).

There are at least two problems with Depoortere’s conclusion. He is too smart not to qualify the situation of set theory about the infinite and he stresses its indeterminacy. The fact that Badiou opts for the void and for atheism means that it is possible to go back and follow Cantor’s preference for God as actually existing infinite. The fact that this situation forces a decision, however, is not only problematic in terms of Badiou’s ontology; it means that Depoortere is forced back into the closed circle that he was hoping to avoid by offering a proof of God’s existence. The decision for God is at the same time a faithful(l) decision, which means that there is no way out of the hermeneutical circle, at least in terms of how Depoortere constructs it in his book. Second, Depoortere relies strongly on the Thomistic and ultimately Aristotelian distinction between actual and potential to decide for God, whereas this traditional opposition may not make as much sense in terms of modern set theory or contemporary philosophy and theology. The most Depoortere is able to gain from his Cantorian mathematical set theory is the possibility of an absolute infinite. He then falls back on Aristotle and Aquinas, as very briefly presented through Rucker, to argue that the possibility of an absolute infinite implies an actual absolute infinite, and to suggest that the existence of transfinite numbers gives us positive knowledge of this actual infinite. But it is clearly a leap of faith to presume that the absolute infinite is reflected in transfinite numbers. Finally, Depoortere is forced to equivocate in terms of this possibility of an absolute infinite, because he needs the absolute infinite to be possible in order to counter Badiou’s atheism, but he needs to overcome the limit of this possibility in order to achieve his purpose, which is to prove the actual existence of God, which is the only way to avoid the closed circle of faith.

The fact that this book is flawed and cannot achieve what it sets out to do does not diminish its value as a work of theological engagement and theoretical reflection. It does not exhaust the possible or actual relations between theology and Badiou’s philosophy, but it is a serious and provocative encounter that is worth much more than the countless surveys and superficial appropriations that generally constitute the genre.