Beckett, Derrida, and the Event of Literature

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Asja Szafraniec, Beckett, Derrida, and the Event of Literature, Stanford University Press, 2007, 246pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804754576.

Reviewed by Gerald Bruns, University of Notre Dame


If there is no such thing as literature -- i.e., self-identity of the literary thing -- if what is announced or promised as literature never gives itself as such, that means, among other things, that a literature that talked only about literature or a work that was purely self-referential would immediately be annulled. You'll say that that's maybe what's happening. In which case it is this experience of the nothing-ing of nothing that interests our desire under the name of literature. Experience of Being, nothing less, nothing more, on the edge of metaphysics, literature perhaps stands on the edge of everything, almost beyond everything, including itself. It's the most interesting thing in the world, maybe more interesting than the world, and this is why, if it has no definition, what is heralded and refused under the name of literature cannot be identified with any other discourse. It will never be scientific, philosophical, conversational.

-- Jacques Derrida, "'This Strange Institution Called Literature': An Interview with Jacques Derrida"[1]

Over the years there have been various efforts to engage Jacques Derrida's conception of literature.[2] I think it is widely acknowledged now that there is (or was) no concept or theory of any sort but instead an ongoing attraction to forms of language that make certain works of writing peculiar enough to trouble the ways in which we make sense of things. Anyhow here is what I think we think we know about Derrida's thinking with respect to literature:

1) There is no literature as such. It is, whatever else it is, the transformation of something given into something other, that is, non-identical, outside the grasp of concepts, categories, distinctions, not to mention purposes, functions, or positions in any standing order of things. This leaves us with almost nothing to say about what a work of literature is. One recalls what Adorno said about the task of art: "To make things of which we do not know what they are."[3]

2) Literature has a history rather than an essence. Derrida's way of addressing this issue is to characterize literature as an "institution," by which he appears to mean (apart from the imposing edifice of French Literature) the history of genres, conventions, forms, and movements with their assorted "isms." No doubt much of what is written belongs to this "institution," but Derrida thinks that every work is always in advance of what the "institution" of literature is able to recognize as belonging to itself. In this respect Derrida is pretty much a classic modernist keyed to experiment and innovation.

3) Literature is thus not so much an object as an event in which each work is absolutely singular, a law unto itself, but perhaps less autonomous than antinomian, irreducible to any reading or appropriation. Literature is a work of writing (écriture) in Maurice Blanchot's sense of the term, referring particularly to the materiality of language that works on us as a kind of limit-experience, that is, an experience that takes us out of the role of cognitive agents grasping things (like texts) and construing their intelligibility. This materiality perhaps forms the meeting ground where philosophy and literature approach only to recoil from one another.

4) How does one register this event of language? There is no "literary hermeneutics." Each experience of a literary work is itself singular and unrepeatable, however "iterable" the work itself may be as a construction of words. One responds to the work not by way of commentary and exegesis but by close attention to the anomalies of the text, its phonic and graphic complexity, its dissonance or antinomies, the openness of its form and the many different directions this may lead us. Such a reading, however, is less philological or critical (much less philosophical) than ludic: the idea is to play along with the text or perhaps to take off from it. Every text is in some sense a pretext, even as every reading is a supplementation or, more exactly perhaps, a kind of marginal writing or parody -- of which Derrida's Glas is perhaps the canonical example.

In the interview from which my epigraph is taken, Derek Attridge noted that Derrida had written on Kafka, Joyce, Mallarmé, Blanchot, Francis Ponge, Paul Celan, and even Antonin Artaud, but not on Samuel Beckett, even though he (Derrida) had devoted seminars to Beckett's work. Why not Beckett? Derrida had no real answer, but noted that, whereas he could find some take-off point in Joyce, Celan, and Blanchot -- an odd word or phrase like He war, Schibboleth or pas -- the Beckett texts for some reason resisted him: "When I found myself, with students, reading some Beckett texts, I would take three lines, I would spend two hours on them, then I would give up because it would not have been possible, or honest, or even interesting, to extract a few 'significant' lines from a Beckett text." To which Derrida then added this strange non-sentence: "The composition, the rhetoric, the construction and rhythm of his works, even the ones that seem most 'decomposed,' that's what 'remains' finally the most 'interesting,' that's the work, that's the signature, this remainder which remains when the thematics is exhausted (and also exhausted, by others, for a long time now, in other modes)" (Acts, p. 61). As if the absolute singularity or alterity of Beckett's texts was no longer an event to be engaged or elaborated but an absolute (or "abyssal") limit, a deadline receding into a past that never was.

But here now is Asja Szafraniec, a philosopher at the University of Amsterdam, with a work of speculative criticism in which she proposes to stage an encounter between Derrida and Beckett -- not, to be sure, a ludic or parodic riff in Derrida's style but rather a philosophical "dialogue" composed of three thematic "points of transaction": (1) the subject, (2) the authority of literature, and (3) negativity. This staging requires some complicated preliminary work, in particular a reconceptualization of the term singularity in order to reconnect it to the philosophical realm of universals. For the Derrida who writes on (or alongside of) Paul Celan, the date is what is absolutely singular, the unrepeatable event, rather like Deleuze's conception of a haecceity or "five o'clock this evening." But in the Attridge interview Derrida endows the singular with a power to formalize itself, such that it is no longer (exactly) irreducible, no longer outside the alternatives of universal and particular, but is "iterable" or "expansive" -- for example, capable of "exemplarity" (Acts, 41-42). Unfortunately Derrida offered no examples of exemplarity, or of what it might be exemplary of. And so Szafraniec tries to explain: "To be exemplary is to be both one of many and one standing for many -- and to stand for many is to be in possession of something that is common to many (i.e., it is equivalent to having acquired a certain generality). It is in this way that the singular acquires its claim to universality" (68). This perhaps returns Derrida too completely to philosophical tradition, but it might capture something. One could put it this way (although Szafraniec does not): The literary work is absolutely singular, an event that cannot be made intelligible by tracing it back to a model or rule; but what this means is that the work is therefore unconstrained -- nothing is forbidden or to be ruled out, as in the famous case of the pun. Taking the pun as an example, the literary work is a kind of semantic exorbitance that in principle might have, to use Derrida's phrase from the Attridge interview that Szafraniec singles out, "the power to say everything [tout dire]" (Acts, 36). My sense is that what this means is that the literary work is an event of freedom rather than of truth, but Szafraniec's aim is to extract from Derrida a conception of literature that possesses what the ancients used to think of as an allegorical potential: "The consensus that there is no such thing as an essence of literature does not put an end to the discussion of what it is that we expect from literature or what its relation, contribution, or relevance to philosophy might be" (56). What this means in particular is that "literature does not exorcise the universal from itself but negotiates an intersection of the singular and the universal within itself as a singular work" (57). So, despite its refractory character, it is still possible for a literary work to be about things that matter to philosophy.

Of the three "points of transaction" that Szafraniec locates between Beckett and Derrida (the subject, authority, and negativity), the question of the subject seems to me of primary interest in view of Derrida's preoccupation with the question of autobiography and, more lately, the question of who I am when "I am not one of the family": "'I am not one of the family' means: do not consider me 'one of you,' 'don't count me in,' I want to keep my freedom, always: this, for me, is the condition not only for being singular and other, but also for entering into relation with the singularity and alterity of others."[4] The who is, whatever else it is, an interrogative pronoun that presupposes a deficiency of definition. "Who is it?" "Who are you?" "Who do you think you are?" Unlike the givenness of the (indubitable) "I," the mode of being of the who is that of being in doubt or in question, being addressed, accused, or called to account. Unlike the "I," the who cannot be made the subject of any theory of the subject; it is a fugitive subject (a "subjectile") that is difficult or impossible to pin down or identify.[5] So Szafraniec seems on the mark when she takes up Beckett's Unnamable as a sort of clandestine companion to the interrogation of the subject that spreads out through much of Derrida's work. The Unnamable is a voice subjected to interminable speech, neither its subject nor its predicate -- "I seem to speak, it is not I, about me, it is not me."[6] And so we get a parody or burlesque of subjectivity, but perhaps only so long as we think of the subject in modernity's terms of a sealed-off punctual ego exercising rational control, since by contrast the Unnamable is really a sort of antique, namely a porous subject of the sort one finds in Ovid, for example, entirely exposed to, permeated, and transformed by alien powers: the Unnamable refers now and again to an anonymous "they" who may or may not be the source of the paratactic speech that pours through him. Alternatively he is a parody of the writer who cannot stop writing -- Sade, Balzac, Sartre, Derrida himself -- and so his subjected condition entails the possibility that literature's alleged "power to say everything" is a curse, or merely the inability of a sorcerer's apprentice to turn things off. In fact in much of Beckett's work speech is experienced as an ironically Irish malady, namely a mad vociferation that, in the play "Not I," for example, reduces the subject to a mouth, a voice, and a single-minded repudiation of the first-person singular. Szafraniec thinks of the Unnamable as moved by a desire to be restored philosophically to self-presence and self-identity, not to say self-mastery, and she elicits the help of Paul Ricoeur's writings on narrative as self-formation to show how the Unnamable fails, and how his failure is also the defeat of Ricoeur's theory, and perhaps of any theory of literature except maybe one that says that literature is, like the Unnamable, just made of words, but not of any of the things we use words to produce (concepts, propositions, narratives, expressions of a subject). The Unnamable is wise to this theory (and so maybe is Derrida) -- "I'm in words, made of words, others' words, what others, the place too, the air, the walls, the floor, the ceiling, all words, the whole world is here with me, I'm in the air, the walls, the walled-in one, everything yields, opens, ebbs, flows, like flakes, I'm all these flakes, meeting, mingling, falling asunder, wherever I go I find me, leave me, go towards me, come from me, nothing ever but me, a particle of me, retrieved, lost, gone astray, I'm all these words, all these strangers, this dust of words, with no ground for their settling" (Grove, 379-80).

Too many words. Perhaps this is why literature has always been called upon to justify itself. What authorizes it? (What is it for?) Szafraniec formulates this problem in what seems to me exactly the right terms -- recall Derrida's conception of the literary work in relation to the "institution" of literature: "What is it," Szafraniec asks, "that gives the subversive literary work its 'right' to enter into and modify the literary institution?" (141) In a certain sense this is the question of questions in twentieth- and now twenty-first-century modernism, where the work of art (as Adorno has shown) aims to free itself from its own concept, that is, from the very project of subsumption, definition, and identity that is required if we are not to wander endlessly in the no man's land of aesthetic nominalism. For philosophers like Arthur Danto, it is precisely at this impasse that art or poetry turns into philosophy, because each work poses the conceptual problem of What is it? that presumably only philosophy can address. Szafraniec turns to Alain Badiou's idea that the poem is purely and simply self-reflexive -- "from here," Badiou writes in "La poésie en condition de la philosophie," "we get the Mallarmean thesis of a sonnet that does not point at anything else than itself, that is itself an echo of the Flaubertian thesis of a novel about nothing; this is modernity. But this nothing, this void, is nothing else but a void surrounded by a torsion of an artistic object upon itself, a self-reference of a poem to itself" (cited by Szafraniec, 150). The task of philosophy is to intervene in this solipsism and to determine something like the "truth conditions" of the poem -- what is it that makes it the thing it is. For Badiou this appears to lie in the poem's capacity to breach the alternatives of universal and particular and to connect up (or, anyhow, connect us up) with an absolutely singular event (conceived perhaps as a kind of break with things as they are). It is not entirely clear how much of Beckett can live up to the task that Badiou has in mind -- recall Beckett's early repudiation of "the art of the feasible":

D. -- What other plane can there be for the maker?

B. -- Logically none. Yet I speak of an art turning from it in disgust, weary of its puny exploits, weary of pretending to be able, of being able, of doing a little better the same old thing, of going a little further down a dreary road.

D. -- And preferring what?

B. -- The expression that there is nothing to express, nothing with which to express, nothing from which to express, no power to express, no desire to express, together with the obligation to express.[7]

Here is the poetics of The Unnamable in all of its uncompromising finitude. Not surprisingly, Badiou, as Szafraniec points out, doesn't much like Beckett's Trilogy or, indeed, much of anything until the late, austere works like Worstward Ho, but he might have been able to extract from the Unnamable's interminable but still strangely exuberant monologue the unforeseeable event to come for which the Unnamable never gives up hope, namely release from the "obligation to express" that (heroically, Sisyphus-like) he never fails to satisfy -- that is, release at last into a final, terminal silence (which one might think of as a condition of freedom: recall that for Blanchot being forced to speak is the greatest injustice). Of course, we who read Beckett, as if knowing better ("dream, dream again, dream of a silence, a dream of silence, full of murmurs" [Grove, 407]), may feel no better for it, but the incongruity between the stasis that confines each Beckett subject and his or her indefatigable, irrepressible subjectivity, as in Happy Days, is simultaneously painful and redemptive, like laughter itself conceived as a moment of freedom. Whether this line of thought would be acceptable to Badiou is a matter that I'll leave to the specialists.

In the epigraph above Derrida writes: "a literature that talked only about literature would immediately be annulled… . In which case it is this experience of the nothing-ing of nothing that interests our desire under the name of literature." The literary work's resistance to identity, its refusal of the concept, is what makes it "the most interesting thing in the world, maybe more interesting than the world, and this is why, if it has no definition, what is heralded and refused under the name of literature cannot be identified with any other discourse. It will never be scientific, philosophical, conversational." Only a negative aesthetics of the kind developed by Adorno could do justice to the literary work. This negativity (in its various contexts and nuances) is for Szafraniec the third point of transaction between Beckett and Derrida, whose interest in negative theology has been well documented but perhaps less often seen as definitive. "How to avoid speaking?" is arguably the regulating question of Derrida's approach to just about everything -- metaphysics, philosophy and literature, God, man, and animal, the secret, not to mention himself, together with whatever in the Derridean distance awaits us or is "always to come." Possibly one could say that Derrida raises the "experience of the nothing-ing of nothing" to the level of philosophical reflection. Negativity is what a commitment to absolute singularity or alterity requires as (dare one say it?) a philosophical method. But of course at some point one has to contrast the garrulousness of Derrida's writing with the increasing austerity of Beckett's work, particularly in some of his later pieces for radio and television, not to mention the tour de force, "Breath." Derrida is not a minimalist but rather an epic circumlocutor for whom there is never enough time to speak or write. "How to avoid speaking" means: "If only one could… ." The Unnamable is arguably Beckett's most Derridean text, to which "Breath" might be a kind of period.

Szafraniec quite properly reads Beckett as someone who in the end approaches language in the manner of a negative theologian, namely by way of subtraction, antinomy, and failure. She seems willing even to go a step further and to suggest that to approach language in this way is itself theologically charged, as if it were an apophatic movement toward "the desired end of the via negativa, according to which only by getting rid of God can we understand his real nature. In the words of Meister Eckhart's confession: 'I pray God to rid me of God'" (182). But perhaps this leaves out the distinctively Irish note, which is that God exists only so that we may joyfully rail against him, as the strangely euphoric creature in Lessness once did and, mysteriously, will now do so again:

Legs a single block arms fast to sides little body face to endlessness. True refuge long last issueless scattered backwards no sound. Blank down four walls over planes sheer white eye calm long last all gone from mind. He will curse God again as in the blessed days face to the open sky passing deluge. Face to calm eye touch close all calm all white all gone from mind.[8]

Think of it: blasphemy as the last pleasure of life, of which mere atheism would deprive us.

[1] Jacques Derrida, Acts of Literature, ed. Derek Attridge (New York: Routledge, 1992), p. 47.

[2] The best book on the subject remains Geoffrey Hartman's Saving the Text: Literature/Derrida/Philosophy (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1981), followed closely by Timothy Clark's Derrida, Heidegger, Blanchot: Sources of Derrida's Notion and Practice of Literature (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992). See also Herman Rapaport, The Later Derrida: Reading the Recent Work (New York: Routledge, 2003), esp. Chapter 2 ("Monolinguism and Literature"), and Peter Mahon's Imagining Joyce and Derrida: Between Finnegans Wake and Glas (Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 2007).

[3] Aesthetic Theory, trans. Robert Hullot-Kentor (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1997), p. 114.

[4] Jacques Derrida and Maurizio Ferraris, A Taste for the Secret, trans. Giacomo Donis (Cambridge: Polity Press, 2001), p. 27.

[5] See Derrida, "Maddening the Subjectile," trans. Mary Ann Caws, Yale French Studies, 84 (1994), 154-71. Derrida doesn't pin down the meaning of "subjectile," which is a term that appears in one of Antonin Artaud's writings, where it appears to be a subject of traversal, which is to say porous, but which Derrida takes to be a figure of the between: neither subject nor object, neither one thing nor another, yet at all events permeable like membrane or a surface.

[6] Samuel Beckett, The Grove Centenary Edition, II: Novels, ed. Paul Auster (New York: Grove Press, 2006), p. 285.

[7] Transition, no. 5 (1949), 98.

[8] (London: Calder and Boyars, 1970), p. 20.