Becoming Human: Romantic Anthropology and the Embodiment of Freedom

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Chad Wellmon, Becoming Human: Romantic Anthropology and the Embodiment of Freedom, The Pennsylvania State University Press, 2010, 326pp., $84.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780271037349.

Reviewed by Patrick Frierson, Whitman College


Becoming Human belongs to two emerging trends in the study of Kant and his early reception: an increasing focus on Kant's anthropological writings for understanding his philosophy as a whole[1] and a resurgence of interest in German Romanticism.[2] Despite its subtitle -- Romantic Anthropology and the Embodiment of Freedom -- the bulk of Becoming Human (at least 150 of its 280 pages) focuses on Kant, so it belongs more squarely within the first trend than the second. Wellmon uses previously little-studied works of Kant's -- his Anthropology and writings on race and history -- to provoke rereading Kant's philosophy as concerned with empirically-rooted accounts of cultivating human freedom rather than merely with a priori articulations of fundamental norms.

Unlike other contemporary studies of Kant's anthropology, however, Wellmon's work aims to show how "Kant's pragmatic anthropology failed because it was not dynamic enough" (276). Wellmon can then explain how German Romanticism, through an aesthetic sensitivity to concrete particulars, provides an "endlessly revisable" category of the human that claims the tensions and paradoxes in Kant's works as bases for "different forms of knowledge" (17).[3] Unfortunately, the book's critique of Kant is based on exaggerated and incomplete readings of Kant's corpus, and the Romantic alternatives are developed through readings of texts that are too focused to justify Wellmon's claims about the prospects for Romantic anthropology. But Wellmon's book nonetheless helpfully moves contemporary debate forward by showing that the late eighteenth- and early nineteenth-century reception of Kant included an important response to the empirically informed Kant that is gaining prominence today.

The book has seven core chapters. Chapter One is the most helpful, offering an overview of anthropology in the eighteenth and early nineteenth century. This chapter introduces figures such as Fülleborn, Platner, Wezel, Pölitz, and Schmid, with some account of their anthropological views and useful references to their most important texts. Chapters Two through Four focus on Kant. Chapter Two, on "Kant's Affective Ethics," uses now-familiar objections to reading Kant's ethics as purely formal to emphasize how "freedom is not a metaphysical discovery but a practical disposition that . . . needs anthropological insights to guide and cultivate individuals" (10). Chapter Three, on Kant's Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View, pays attention almost exclusively to the Anthropology's final few pages (ignoring the vast majority of the book), and thereby reads the Anthropology as fundamentally about humans' historical vocation. Chapter Four focuses on Kant's debate with Forster over differences between human races and introduces, in Forster, the first of many alternatives to Kant.

The chapters on Kant provide for a Foucaultian reading of Kant that would warrant some response from more committed Kantians, but they add very little to the scholarly literature on Kant, and they engage with very little of that literature. In this respect, Chapter Four is typically disappointing; Wellmon mentions the vibrant scholarly discussion about the relationship between Kant's views on race and his philosophy as a whole but simply notes that he is "less interested" in those discussions (152), such that even after his analysis, "the question still remains as to what role nonwhite races play in Kant's idea of a universal human destiny" (162). Similarly, after several chapters exploring the tensions and paradoxes related to the universality of Kant's anthropology, Wellmon only barely mentions, in the last paragraph of his discussion of Kant, the possibility that this universality might be merely "comparative," a proposal that would have alleviated much of the apparent paradox.

Chapters Five to Seven take up Romantic "responses to Kant," with a narrowly focused chapter on Schleiermacher's colonial history of New Holland (Five), a fairly broad-ranging reading of "Novalis's Anthropology of the Senses" (Six), and a discussion of Goethe and the early writings of Humboldt (especially those related to his trips to the Basque region) as moving towards a linguistically oriented anthropology of the "lively gaze" (Seven). These chapters provide interesting but narrow discussions of particular German Romantic forays into anthropology; they do not represent a comprehensive account of Romantic anthropology, but they provide a start for what I hope will be yet more work in this area.

As this brief overview suggests, the book is an eclectic mix of chapters, and any of them could stand on its own without losing anything in terms of its argument. (Unsurprisingly, Chapters Two, Five, and Six appeared in prior versions as articles.) Still, although much of the book focuses on narrow details of particular texts, one overarching theme is the effort to use supposed tensions in early anthropology to motivate and begin to answer the question "How can an account of the human being be both normatively compelling and empirically open?" (275). The book lays out a narrative that begins with a portrayal of Kant as much more interesting than apriorist caricatures often make him out to be, but as ultimately foundering on the problem of integrating his normative emphases with empirical details about human beings. German Romantics then enter the story with increasingly sophisticated and dynamic forms of pragmatic anthropology that develop this problem in positive ways.

Becoming Human depends upon a specific conception of "anthropology" and the paradoxes to which it is subject, a conception heavily indebted to Foucault (pp. 5-6). The "anthropology" of Becoming Human is the anthropology of Foucault's The Order of Things, rather than anything clearly recognizable as contemporary anthropology (or even, as I will argue, Kant's anthropology). As Wellmon emphasizes, his focus is "less in the discipline that would become anthropology than in that more profound mode of anthropological thinking that Foucault calls modernity" (6). Throughout the book, Wellmon constantly finds what Foucault described as the "analytic of finitude," the "doubling of the human being as both the subject who observes and object being observed" (18, cf. e.g. 15, 25, 108, 128) and the consequent "irreducible tension between the empirical and the transcendental, the natural and the moral" (7). Thus Kant's anthropology supposedly "relied on the conjoining, or confusion even, of the transcendental and empirical" (100); Schleiermacher "became increasingly concerned with the reduplication of the human being as both observer and observed" (199); and Novalis "turn[s] anthropological inquiry back on itself in a recursive act" (213). Wellmon discusses eighteenth- and early nineteenth-century anthropologies in a "recovery effort" to fill in details left passed over by Foucault's own treatment of modernity in The Order of Things and to "locate the ethos of modernity, of which Foucault speaks, in anthropology's early moment of crisis" (12).

In accordance with the goal of unearthing crises, Wellmon consistently exaggerates bases for tension in early anthropologies. This is particularly pronounced in Kant, where, for example, the moral law is taken to be "unintelligible" and "inconceivable" (81); the "desires of reason" for a "feeling-experience of the [moral] law" are described as "infinite desires of reason" for an "impossible experience" of that law (95); difficulties with self-observation are described as a "transcendental impossibility of anthropology" (130-1); and there is an "apparent impossibility" in trying to "conceptualize . . . that which is not simply reason, the human" (179). But Wellmon's joy in tension and contradiction is evident in other figures as well. The multifarious attempts of early "proto-anthropology" to "conceive of the human being as both a physical and a moral being" all end up in "paradoxes and misunderstandings" (44). Schleiermacher's nuanced balancing of universal and particular in religious experience is described as a "tension between universal and particular" (206). And Humboldt's recognition that striving for self-cultivation (Bildung) involves "risk" is taken to imply a "paradox of Bildung" (255). Throughout the book, then, there is an invocation of hyperbolic language to assert the impossibility of various attempts at making sense of the interplay between different aspects of a complete account of the human being.

Given his overall narrative and his fascination with paradox and contradiction, it is unsurprising that Wellmon seeks to develop a reading of Kant that emphasizes the limitations and contradictions in his thought. The book is filled with examples of this tendency, but I'd like to focus briefly on one particularly important claim that sets up the need for a Romantic alternative to Kant's anthropology: "despite Kant's consistent efforts to bracket . . . transcendental questions [in his anthropology], the theoretical and transcendental difficulties of anthropological inquiry remain" (125). Wellmon rightly recognizes that Kant sees his pragmatic anthropology as ultimately dependent upon the solution of transcendental problems that this pragmatic anthropology does not solve. Not only do many of the norms towards which pragmatic anthropology is oriented require a priori backing (in Kant's moral philosophy), but the possibility of empirical investigation itself depends upon a transcendental account of human knowledge. And Wellmon rightly sees Kant as seeking to distinguish merely empirical investigation of the human being from inquiry into human norms. But unlike Foucault himself, who takes the fact that "Kant had demonstrated the division between [the empirical and the transcendental]"[4] to imply that "The Kantian moment" cannot properly be considered part of the "Modern Age" in which the problem of anthropology arises,[5] Wellmon sees Kant's insistence on this distinction as somehow disingenuous or unsustainable. Kant might want to keep transcendental and anthropological separate, but he thereby ends up with an anthropology that fails to sufficiently investigate its own conditions of possibility.

There might be a good argument for this claim about the impossibility of Kantian anthropology, and the German Romantics might even have made this argument, but Wellmon does not. The key problem with Wellmon's reading of Kant is that in his focus on the anthropological texts that he wants to "recover" (12), Wellmon largely ignores Kant's other works, even when theey are particularly relevant. Wellmon rightly points out that "the empirical I can never fully ground anthropology inquiry" and claims that "Kant delimits the task of anthropology . . . by bracketing the entire problem" (115-6). But he quite wrongly claims that this delimiting arises from "the apparent impossibility of anthropology" and that the "problem [of self-grounding] -- the doubling of anthropological reflection -- haunts Kant's entire anthropology" (116). Wellmon quotes Kant's claim that this problem "does not actually belong to anthropology . . . This inquiry belongs to metaphysics, which has to do with the possibility of knowledge a priori" (Kant's Anthr 7:142-3, in Wellmon, 116). But immediately after citing this clear demarcation of the scope of anthropology and transcendental philosophy, Wellmon claims that these very passages "reveal how Kant's pragmatic anthropology sometimes mixes the transcendental task of philosophy and the empirical task of anthropology" (116) and that "the transcendental conditions of knowledge intrude on anthropology -- that is, they blur the line between philosophy and anthropology" (117). Kant's "bracketing" becomes an "erasure" that "merely conceals these problems from view" (129). But Kant mentions transcendental concerns precisely to show how they are different from the concerns of anthropology and will not be addressed in anthropology.

Such concerns "remain" only if one fails to read the texts in which Kant does address these concerns, most notably the Critique of Pure Reason. But there is no attention paid to that text at all in Wellmon's analysis.[6] Even after investigating the arguments of the first Critique, one might be left with questions about self-knowledge. Kant's emphasis in the first Critique is on knowledge of objects of outer sense, and he famously denies the possibility of a science of psychology, so one might reasonably ask how the conditions of possibility of knowledge laid out in the Critique relate to the claims about human beings in the Anthropology. One might also ask how the subject of transcendental philosophizing relates to the "I think" that is, in at least some sense, the "object" of such philosophizing. But either of these questions would require examination of the texts in which Kant does not bracket these concerns, the texts to which he appeals in his Anthropology. And, unfortunately, Wellmon gives us no such examination.

As I've already noted, Wellmon's book is much more focused on Kant than one might have expected, and I've suggested that the discussion of Kant fails to sufficiently set up the need for the Romantic alternatives that Wellmon pursues in the remaining chapters. These discussions also tend to be too focused to provide good overviews of the anthropological thinking of each Romantic anthropologist. The discussion of Schleiermacher is focused closely on Scheiermacher's early colonial history of New Holland, in keeping with the origin of this chapter as a journal article but less helpful for the overall narrative of the book. And the chapter on Humboldt prescinds from discussing "Humboldt's later, more canonical writings on language" in order to "focus on his two early essays on anthropology and the travelogue of his trip to the Basque country" (237).

Nonetheless, Wellmon's chapters on Romantic anthropologies are very helpful for introducing readers to new figures and/or new material from familiar figures, and Wellmon is generous with references and quotations from less-well-known authors and texts. Wellmon's readings of these Romantic anthropologists describe a set of new approaches to anthropology that do offer genuine alternatives to Kant in their integration of revisable, empirical accounts of human beings at the core of normative self-reflection about "the" human being. And by giving focused and stimulating snapshots of a variety of approaches, Wellmon's book can and should serve as a call to embark on further work exploring Romantic accounts of human beings that may prove to be viable and even preferable alternatives to Kant's pragmatic anthropology.

[1] This trend includes books such as G. Felicitas Munzel's Kant's Conception of Character, Robert Louden's Kant's Impure Ethics, my own Freedom and Anthropology in Kant's Moral Philosophy, Holly Wilson's Kant's Pragmatic Anthropology, and John Zammito's Kant, Herder, and the Birth of Anthropology. Further books -- including, for example, Allen Wood's Kant's Ethical Thought -- make Kant's anthropological theses central to discussions of broader issues in Kant.

[2] See, for example, Fred Beiser's The Romantic Imperative, Andrew Bowie's Aesthetics and Sensitivity, Jane Kneller's Kant and the Power of Imagination, and a host of translations, not only of German Romantics themselves but also of important secondary works, such as Manfred Frank's The Philosophical Foundations of Early German Romanticism.

[3] Wellmon's work is also a fitting part of Penn State's Literature and Philosophy series, hovering between literary criticism and philosophical analysis. In some cases, this leads to overblown and bizarre readings of familiar philosophical texts, as when Wellmon claims that the adverb "once and for all" (einmal) in theGroundwork's claim "once and for all to work out a pure moral philosophy" (4:389, Wellmon 56) implies that "Metaphysical cleansing is a singular event" (57) and reveals the "contrasting temporalities of pure and impure ethics" (57). But in other cases -- such as his close reading of Novalis's Hymnen an die Nacht (215-17) or very nice analysis of Humboldt's description of a Basque dance in Durango (267-8) -- Wellmon's literary sensitivity helps him develop distinctive accounts of various anthropologies.

[4] Michael Foucault, The Order of Things: An Archaeology of the Human Sciences, Vintage Books (1994), 341.

[5] Foucault, The Order of Things, 343.

[6] One rare exception proves the rule. On p. 61, Wellmon claims that "in the Kritik der reinen Vernuft, Kant writes that a causality from freedom 'must be assumed'," citing the Thesis of Kant's Third Antinomy, that is, the conclusion of an argument that Kant's shows to be fallacious.