Becoming Visionary: Brian De Palma's Cinematic Education of the Senses

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Eyal Peretz, Becoming Visionary: Brian De Palma's Cinematic Education of the Senses, Stanford University Press, 2007, 224pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804756853.

Reviewed by Gregg Lambert, Syracuse University


The key argument of Eyal Peretz's Becoming Visionary is given by the book's subtitle and by one of its leading epigraphs. The subtitle is Brian De Palma's Cinematic Education of the Senses. The epigraph in question is taken from Plato's Republic, Book VII: "Education takes for granted that sight is there from the beginning but that it isn't turned the right way or looking where it ought to look, and thus seeks to redirect it appropriately." It is in the re-education of the senses that cinema and philosophy can be said to share a common or related task. Both the philosopher and the director assume that seeing is there as a condition of their enterprise, even though for philosophy seeing is sometimes reduced to an image of common sense or opinion. Each seeks to intervene in this field defined by common perceptions and, in some sense, to wage war with the clichés of vision and thought. The philosopher brings his or her concepts to the battle. As Peretz shows, the director has one weapon in his or her arsenal: the frame. Certainly the frame enacts the definition of education above: given sight, employing the frame to direct or to redirect vision.

Following Nietzsche, the French philosopher Gilles Deleuze redefined the Platonic sense of education according to the more disciplinary sense of paidea, or a "violent retraining of the senses." When we consider the great cinematic pedagogues, Eisenstein comes to mind as one who considered the modern technological art of cinema as a disciplinary tool for retraining the senses in a larger curriculum of public education. By comparison, it is odd to think of a director like De Palma in this regard.  However, Chapter One of Peretz's book chooses to frame the discussion of De Palma's cinema by focusing upon the opening shot of Carrie, which takes place in a schoolyard showing a group of high school girls playing volleyball during gym. The scene of education is already there in De Palma's meditation on the question of cinema, particularly physical education in which the body is organized and disciplined by being codified through a game of volleyball; although, De Palma will quickly oppose this coordinated image of the body to another image of the body that is determined by the horror of sexuality and is graphically represented by Carrie's bleeding and enigmatic wound. Peretz sees the game itself as an allegory of the cinematic image itself, or what Deleuze called the "movement image," in which the movement of bodies between states of motion and rest is codified by the convention of the horror genre. Just as the accidental fall disturbs the rules of the game, producing a suspension of the body's motion that "exceeds all the categories of the game as meaning," De Palma understands this suspension of the movement-image as precisely what horrifies (and how to horrify):

Thus, reading this game as an allegory of what De Palma's cinema is about, we might say that film, for De Palma, is this discovery of a horrifying and suspenseful movement at the obscure heart of the light of day (29, author's emphasis).

We might take this example of a particular scene from De Palma's films, which then becomes an allegory for reading De Palma's cinematic meditation on the cinematic image, as an element belonging to Peretz's own technique of framing. In each of the subsequent chapters Peretz offers a close reading of a pivotal series of frames from one of De Palma's films (The Fury, Blow-Out, Femme-Fatale), which he then develops into a critical meditation on the "sense of the image." Peretz's overall argument concerning this image-sense is summarized in the introduction:

This book claims that it is the cinematic image that has expressed in a particularly profound manner, and perhaps more deeply than the images of any other artistic medium, this new condition of the image as the inscription of a blank beyond, a closure to the senses, internal to the world and to the very activity of the senses. (18)

Here, what Peretz calls "the blank beyond" is what he claims that the cinematic image, exemplified in the cinema of De Palma, points to as part of its educational task of reorienting the senses. What this  image "shows us" (the audience, the reader) is "this beyond that is part of our world, that which makes our eye experience its own blindness as the dimension of futurity (and of an immemorial past)" (14-15). In other words, what the image shows, and what a certain technique of framing the image directs us to see, is time. The image in question is what Deleuze has formulated in his second Cinema volume as the "time-image."

This is the virtue of Peretz's use of Deleuze, which distinguishes his discussion from the standard commentaries on Deleuze's cinema volumes, such as David Rodowick's The Time-Machine. He does not employ the philosopher's work in order to clarify, much less defend or justify, the historical thesis of the "time-image" as a staple of post-WWII cinema. (Ironically, the author states that this is outside the frame of his own argument.) Implicitly, Peretz already agrees with Deleuze's larger historical claim, but only in as much as this might inform our understanding of the techniques of framing and narration that he finds "paradigmatically employed" in Brian De Palma's cinema. In order to explain the meaning of the time-image, we might again simply refer to Peretz's reading of the volleyball game in Carrie. Basically, Deleuze's thesis concerns the emergence of a new determination of the cinematic image that breaks with the conventions of classical cinema, based on the dominance of the narrative coordinates of the movement-image. Allegorically, just as the accidental fall abruptly suspends the coordinated movements of the game, opening a dimension of futurity that is unforeseen and unforeseeable, De Palma immediately frames this to the image of Carrie's accidental discovery of her own sexualized body in the shower scene that follows. Thus, both senses of the accident are connected in the image of Carrie's bleeding body by what Deleuze calls an "irrational cut" which opens to a dimension of an "outside" that is both internal to the world and yet closed to the senses. If, as Peretz argues, there is something "paradigmatic that is the paradigmatic gesture of De Palma's cinema," it is the manner in which the image produces a sense of horror from an inside that remains, nonetheless, beyond the frame, thereby adding another dimension to the sense of the accidental that De Palma investigates by transforming the previous conventions of the horror genre.

Any contemporary literary critic willfully avoids the accusation of allegorical interpretation, just as much as any contemporary film studies critic avoids the charge of auteurism. Peretz willfully skirts a dangerous line with the Scylla and Charybdis in the academic field of criticism these days, but in my view, can be accused neither of simple allegoresis, nor naïve auteurism. In his forward to the volume, which appears to be a dressing up of an earlier reader's report, Stanley Cavell makes a strong pitch for situating Peretz's study in the, as of yet, non-existent North-American field of Film and Philosophy, which would also include Cavell's own recent studies of film in The World Viewed. (Here, Cavell confesses to "a certain latitude of explicit immodesty" by including his book on the proposed syllabus.)  The many reasons for this field's current non-existence would be easy to explain, but I will not go into great detail for fear of merely irritating colleagues in my own department.  Let’s just say that there is a prohibition against developing such a field of inquiry which has developed in severity over the past ten years in the Humanities, and is taken to be the law of the land primarily in the academic disciplines of Philosophy, English, and Cultural Studies. Aside from providing a partial explanation from his own location in Philosophy, or "from more or less that tradition" of Continental Philosophy, Cavell refers the reader to the author's own explanation in Chapter Two, note 37.  Turning to this reference, we find only: "In Martin Heidegger, Poetry, Language, Thought (Harper & Row, pp. 15-89)."  Because I believe this is an error, and because I take it on faith that Cavell is not here referring us to Heidegger's "The Origin of the Work of Art" to explain the fate of Film and Philosophy in the North-American academy, I will assume he is referring to Chapter Two, note 6, where Peretz engages in a discussion of the differences between the way the frame operates in painting, photography, and in film, and where he explicitly links this difference to Derridean elaborations of the "pareragonal" status of the act of framing (in Truth and Painting) and also to Cavell's concept of a "logic of rejection" in rethinking these differences.

The note ends by announcing a new logic that "will constitute a new relation to the work of art, conceived not as a relation to a separate and autonomous, that is, framed aesthetic object" (180). It is this announcement of a new manner of framing the study of film -- in Philosophy and in Film Studies as well -- that incites my affirmation of the goals announced by this project. In other words, is there not a "logic of rejection" that currently frames the cinematic image as either a separate and autonomous area of study, or as belonging to a specialized field of aesthetic objects of inquiry, in the latter case determined by a 19th century logic that corresponded to the medium of painting? Apart from the more lofty goal of overcoming the Platonic determination of the image, which is claimed in the introduction, I find this more epistemological objective much more attainable and easy to understand. Re-frame the image! In other words, let us assume that the current situation of film as an object of knowledge isn't turned the right way or looking where it ought to look, and thus let us seek to redirect it appropriately.