Being for Beauty: Aesthetic Agency and Value

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Dominic McIver Lopes, Being for Beauty: Aesthetic Agency and Value, Oxford University Press, 2018, 266pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198827214.

Reviewed by Robert Stecker, Central Michigan University


The ambitious aim of this book is to offer a completely new, if partial, account of aesthetic value. This account is meant to stand in contrast with what Dominic McIver Lopes understands to be the received view -- aesthetic hedonism -- and the central chapters argue for the superiority of the new account over it.

Aesthetic hedonism, as characterized by Lopes, asserts that aesthetic value is a property of an item that stands in constitutive relation to finally valuable pleasurable experiences of subjects who correctly understand the item. (53) In simpler if less precise language, things are aesthetically valuable if they would please for their own sake under certain conditions. Pace Lopes, aesthetic hedonism provides the kernel of a complete aesthetic theory in the sense that it tells us when something is an aesthetic value. To do that, it has to answer two questions. (41-43) The aesthetic question is what makes a value an aesthetic one? The normative question is what makes aesthetic value a value? Answering each question requires further unpacking of aesthetic hedonism, but pleasurable experience will be at the heart of both answers.

The rival theory that Lopes offers is network theory. Network theory is not a complete aesthetic theory or even the kernel of one. It is intended to answer the normative question, and only that question. Lopes believes that answers to the normative question explain why a property (that is a value) is reason giving. A rough approximation of network theory says that: An aesthetic value V is reason giving = the fact that x is V lends weight to the proposition that it would be an aesthetic achievement for an agent S to do A in C. (The precise version adds to this: 'where x is an item in an aesthetic practice K and S's competence to do A is aligned upon an aesthetic profile that is constitutive of K.') (127)

Since Lopes is just interested in answering the normative question, in deciding which of the two theories give a better answer, it is hard to compare network theory with aesthetic hedonism as stated above. How does aesthetic hedonism answer this question? Lopes's answer is roughly: An aesthetic value V is reason giving = the fact that x is v lends weight to the proposition that it would maximize S's pleasure were S to do A in C. (The precise version adds: where S's hedonic responses are calibrated to those of true judges in joint verdict.) (Call this standardized aesthetic hedonism, because that is what Lopes calls it). (61) Clearly this is an alternative to network theory. One view says an aesthetic value is reason giving because doing something to realize it might maximize one's pleasure. The other view says that aesthetic value is reason giving because doing something to realize it might be an aesthetic achievement within some aesthetic practice. One can act for both reasons at the same time, but they are rival ways of answering the normative question as Lopes sees the debate.

Lopes's main argument for network theory over standardized aesthetic hedonism is that it explains the aesthetic facts better. Which facts? Facts about 'aesthetic experts.' In the first chapter, he describes various 'aesthetic experts' and six facts about them, and these become the explananda used to test the two rival theories. The facts are: 1. Aesthetic experts disperse into almost all demographic niches. 2. Aesthetic experts jointly inhabit the whole aesthetic universe. 3. Aesthetic experts specialize by aesthetic domain. 4. Aesthetic experts specialize by activity. 5. Specialization by activity and domain interact. 6. Aesthetic expertise is relatively stable. (25-31) Standardized aesthetic hedonism does a poor job in answering some of these questions, especially 1, 3, 4, and perhaps 5, whereas network theory is made to answer them. So if this is the right test, network theory clearly wins at least against standardized aesthetic hedonism.

In addition to the main argument, Lopes offers 5 'bonus arguments.' These are not direct arguments in favor of network theory over hedonism, but at best, indirect ones. Each argument, occupying one of the remaining five chapters of the book, takes up an issue in aesthetics not answered by either of the two rival theories or at least not by network theory, offers an answer and argues that it comports well with the latter theory. One issue is aesthetic motivation. What motivates us to expend significant resources on our aesthetic endeavors? Hedonism does provide an answer, while network theory does not, but Lopes argues that network theory jibes better with the correct answer given by current psychology. Other issues concern aesthetic disagreement, the metaphysics of aesthetic value, its place in a good or meaningful life, its place in society. In each case, the argument is not that network theory provides the answer, but that it jibes well with network theory.

How successful is the book's main argument, which is by far the most important one for network theory? As mentioned above, network theory is superior to standardized aesthetic hedonism in accounting for the six facts arrayed in the main argument. But why these facts? There are plenty others that are relevant to answering the normative question about aesthetic value that have nothing to do with 'aesthetic experts' or true judges for that matter. For example, human beings appear to have always pursued aesthetic value going back to prehistory. What is it about the aesthetic that made it universally sought after? And why do aesthetic choices confront us so frequently in our lives? Will network theory give the best answer to these questions?

One reason to think that it won't is the practice-centered conception of aesthetic value implied by network theory. Aesthetic values are properties it would be an achievement to realize within a practice. But achievements within a practice aren't always or even typically what explains the value of the practice, acts within it, and the products of those acts. Consider achievement in sport or chess. It's an achievement to steal second base or capture the queen. But what makes sport and chess valuable human endeavors, and makes the achievements within those endeavors impressive, has to be explained from a point of view outside the practices, by appealing to values that transcend the individual practice. This may not always be true (think about achievements in medicine), but if it is not true for aesthetic practices, that case still has to be made. To take some typically Lopesian examples, that an image is a wicked take on a meme, that a novel is smartly cheerful, or that a knot is wabi-sabi (a good making feature) rather than wonky (bad) look to me like achievements more like stealing second base or making a perfect pass rather than like discovering how to do open heart surgery.

Another reason for doubt about network theory that also derives from its practice-centered nature is that few practices are just aesthetic practices. Obviously knot tying isn't. Nor is baseball, chess, or mathematics. Nor painting, photography, or most other artistic practices. The problem this raises is that achievements within a practice will sometimes be aesthetic achievements, sometimes not, and sometimes will have both aesthetic and non-aesthetic aspects like a perfect pass or (I take it) a knot being wabi-sabi. Hence the fact that something lends weight to the proposition that it would be an achievement for an agent S to do A in C in an 'aesthetic' practice K does not mean that the achievement is wholly or even partly aesthetic. Lopes is sanguine that we can identify the properties of achievements and their products that make them aesthetic, but it's not obvious that it will always be so easy to do so, absent an answer to the aesthetic question.

Finally, there is a more general problem, not so much with the main argument, but an assumption behind it. Even if we accept that network theory is superior to standardized aesthetic hedonism, that is to establish a very limited conclusion. The latter view is based on one interpretation of Hume's 'Of the Standard of Taste' (actually an interpretation of an interpretation) proposed by Jerrold Levinson. There are other ways of developing aesthetic hedonism that might provide better answers to the normative question in comparison with network theory. More important, aesthetic hedonism is not the dominant view today that Lopes portrays it being. Few people working in aesthetics today actually hold that view. Aesthetic hedonism has been superseded by aesthetic empiricism, which claims that aesthetic value is a primarily a property of a subclass of finally valuable experiences, and secondarily a property of things that have the capacity to provide those experiences, but not all of these experiences are pleasurable ones. Some, involving negative emotions or painful aspects of human life, are positively unpleasant. Finally, as far as the dominance of this view goes, it is better to think of aesthetic empiricism as one of two rival views, the other being the view that that primary bearers of aesthetic value are aesthetic properties of the objects of aesthetic appreciation and evaluation. In this book, Lopes has moved camp from the former view to the latter.

Lopes's book is essential reading for philosophers interested in aesthetic value. The criticisms just stated are a response to the serious challenge it poses to experience-based conceptions of that kind of value. It is not an easy read, bristling with definitions only a sample of which were stated above. Even its examples are often esoteric. But it is worth the effort to master these challenges for the new approaches the book contains.