Being, Freedom, and Method: Themes from the Philosophy of Peter van Inwagen

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John A. Keller (ed.), Being, Freedom, and Method: Themes from the Philosophy of Peter van Inwagen, Oxford University Press, 2017, 402pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198715702.

Reviewed by John Schwenkler, Florida State University


Among philosophers today, Peter van Inwagen's reputation for failure to understand things stands out in much the same way, if not quite to the same degree, as Socrates' self-proclaimed ignorance was known among the Athenians. In each case the deficit in question is arguably overstated. Socrates was certainly wiser than his fellow citizens, and not only in the knowledge of his limits. Likewise, van Inwagen might in fact understand more things than he believes he does -- and it is a near certainty that he understands many more things than the average philosopher.

An important difference, however, is that whereas Socrates expressed his ignorance in the confidence that, at least in many cases, there was indeed something (some Form) in the vicinity that stood ready for the philosopher to grasp, the implication of van Inwagen's professed lack of understanding is that the things he professes not to understand might not even be candidate objects of understanding. As John A. Keller writes in his introduction, this latter possibility is one that philosophers should be more concerned about than we usually tend to be:

No one, or hardly anyone, gets upset if, like van Inwagen, you say that certain unfashionable things like agent causation, bare particulars, or hylomorphism make no sense. But if, also like van Inwagen, you say that temporal parts, substitutional quantification, or tropes make no sense, you are likely to be accused of deliberately not understanding things, or of lying about what you understand, or worse. (p. 1)

In my brief time studying at Notre Dame, graduate students had a name for this accusation: the offending party was 'Petering out'. In addition, however, to the fact that even a pretense of non-understanding, like the Socratic tactic of feigning ignorance before a class of undergraduates, can be a spur to philosophical progress, this complaint ignored the very real possibility that we were at fault, not van Inwagen, that in fact we were talking nonsense and he was the only one with the good sense to see this and the courage to say so. Keller continues:

Most of us think that many locutions that were once widespread in metaphysical theorizing are ultimately incoherent. But then how can we be sure that locutions that are currently widespread in metaphysical theorizing are not ultimately incoherent? . . . We must admit, if we are being honest, that some of the locutions currently employed by metaphysicians will turn out to be just as incoherent as some of the locutions employed in the past. But then none of us understands them, at least if the following principle is true:

The Nonsense Principle: If something doesn't make sense, then no one understands it. (ibid.)

In fact the situation is even worse than this -- and not only because the possibilities for contemporary nonsense are hardly limited to metaphysics. (This philosopher is waiting for 'qualia' to go the way of 'sense data', 'intentions' the way of 'volitions', and 'morality' the way of 'best total state of affairs'.) If a locution L is incoherent, the upshot of this is not only that we do not understand L, nor even that no one understands L (or ever has or ever will), nor even that the understanding of L lies beyond the limits of finite minds like our own, but rather that L is not even a candidate for understanding. (Not even for an angel, a god, or God himself -- if indeed any of that makes sense to say.) When we are dealing with nonsense, philosophical or otherwise, there is simply 'no there there': no truth or falsity asserted, no reality described or misdescribed, nor any way to do these philosophically essential things until our language has been cleaned up. As van Inwagen writes in his contribution to this volume, having accused L.A. Paul of writing meaningless nonsense:

meaninglessness is what we risk in doing metaphysics; what one risks in metaphysics isn't being wrong -- except in a sense in which someone who believes that a cube root can be extracted with a forceps is "wrong." What we risk is not even being wrong. (p. 351)

Nor, again, is this a risk only in metaphysics. Where it is a live possibility, that is something that should keep a philosopher up at night.

I am not sure how much nonsense there is in the pages of this volume, nor do I plan to indicate any of the places where I have my suspicions. (Except: time travel?) It is, unquestionably, a very good volume -- each essay in it is at least very good, several are simply excellent, and despite the diversity of topics and philosophical approaches there is enough interrelation among them that, speaking non-metaphysically but no doubt at risk of nonsense anyway, the whole is more than the sum of its parts. Following Keller's introduction the essays proceed under four headings that correspond to main themes in van Inwagen's work: Being, Freedom, God, and Method. (I will assume that the reason why 'God' didn't receive top billing is that editors prefer for titles to come in threes.) Following these is a 'Concluding Meditation' by van Inwagen, who replies to seven of the seventeen essays before, he admits, having to cut himself off in the interests of time and space. Having said this much by way of preface, your reviewer will have to do some of the same in what follows.

Part I, on Being, begins with Michael J. Loux's 'Theories of Character', which lays out the conceptual space for philosophical discussion of the so-called problem of universals. Loux argues that there are really a number of different philosophical problems that come together here, that many distinctions that are sometimes treated as equivalent in fact concern quite different metaphysical issues, and that many commonly supposed entailments between the positions on offer -- e.g. the connection between denying that universals have spatial or spatiotemporal location and construing universals as necessary beings -- can reasonably be resisted.

Following Loux's essay, in 'A One Category Ontology' Paul develops an ontology that doesn't seem to fit exactly in Loux's framework. Paul's mereological bundle theory regards the world as built of one fundamental kind of thing, intrinsic character or quality, according to one fundamental relation, composition. Thus there are no fundamental or irreducibly emergent differences between substances and their properties, wholes and their parts, or space and the things that occupy it. Eric T. Olson's 'Properties as Parts of Ordinary Objects' then defends a position located opposite to Paul's along several dimensions of conceptual space, arguing that there ought to be an illuminating and nontrivial explanation of what it is for a particular thing to have a given character, and that this aspect of the 'ontological structure' of the world can't be explained by saying that properties constitute particulars. For Olson, the relation between a concrete particular and its properties is entirely different from that between a whole and its parts.

The last essay in Part I, Sara Bernstein's 'Time Travel and the Movable Present', builds on van Inwagen's paper 'Changing the Past' (1990) by developing a model of time travel according to which a person travels through time by shifting the location of the objective present. Unlike van Inwagen's earlier model, Bernstein's does not presuppose a 'growing block' conception of time, though it does depend on the assumption of an objective present.

Part II: Freedom begins with one of the highlights of the volume, Mark Heller's essay 'The Disconnect Problem and the Influence Strategy'. Heller draws on van Inwagen's An Essay on Free Will (1983) and 'Free Will Remains a Mystery' (2000) in developing and defending a version of the 'luck argument' against libertarian theories of free will. Briefly, Heller's argument is that since the degree of control we have over our choices is proportional to the degree of influence that our reasons have on them, therefore contra libertarianism, 'the closer we get to determinism, the more free will we have' (p. 107). He closes by sketching a contextualist analysis on which attributions of free will are true in some contexts but false in others.

In the rest of Part II, Alicia Finch's 'Revisiting the Mind Argument' offers new formulations of the 'consequence argument' for incompatibilism and the 'Mind argument' against libertarianism found in van Inwagen (1983), and Neal A. Tognazzini and John Martin Fischer's 'Incompatibilism and the Fixity of the Past' and Wesley H. Holliday's 'Freedom and Modality' together make up a 'Symposium on the Fixity of the Past' that focuses on an argument by Holliday (in his (2012)) for a crucial premise in van Inwagen's (1983) formulation of the consequence argument. Unlike most of the rest of the essays, which will offer a lot to specialists but could also be taught in mid-level undergraduate surveys, these three are quite technical and presuppose considerable prior familiarity with the debates that they engage.

Part III: God is where the stakes get higher. Louise Antony's 'Defenseless' is a critique of the defense of theism against the argument from evil in van Inwagen's 2003 Gifford Lectures, published in 2006 as The Problem of Evil. There, van Inwagen inserted himself into an imaginary debate with an atheist, before an audience of rational agnostics, arguing that the atheist's evidential argument from evil against the existence of God is, in a somewhat technical sense, a failure. As the terms are used here, 'failure' is the Aristotelian contradictory of 'success', with the latter defined as follows:

An argument for [e.g.] nominalism will be counted a success . . . if and only if an ideal nominalist can use it to convert, eventually to convert, an audience of ideal agnostics (sc. with respect to the existence of universals) to nominalism. And, of course, it is stipulated that the conversion must take place under the following circumstances: an ideal realist is present during the nominalist's attempt to convert the agnostics and will employ every rational means possible, at every stage of the debate, to block the nominalist's attempt at conversion. (van Inwagen 2006, p. 45)

In The Problem of Evil, the thesis being argued for is the non-existence of a morally good and omnipotent being, and the argument put forward by the atheist says that the extent of suffering in our world shows that such a being probably does not exist -- for such a being would not permit such suffering unless it were the only way to achieve a 'surpassingly important moral goal' (Antony, 'Defenseless', p. 169), and it is improbable that a being like God could not achieve his important moral goals in some other way than by permitting the existence of widespread suffering. To show that this argument (hereafter 'EAE', i.e. the evidential argument from evil) fails in his sense, van Inwagen attempts to undercut this last premise -- not by arguing that it is false, but merely by making a case that it could be, since that should be enough to prevent the agnostic audience from accepting any argument that depends essentially on it.

Antony's essay reverses the charge, arguing that it is van Inwagen's defense that fails, as his attempt to show why God might allow the suffering that exists in our world simply 'trade[s] in one mystery for another' (p. 166). This is because, in order to undermine EAE, it is not enough just to show that this last premise 'could be' false in the sense that there 'could be' flying pigs (see p. 172). And Antony's philosophical atheist

does not deny that there might be some story according to which an omnipotent being permissibly tolerates the kinds, amounts, and distribution of suffering that we observe in our world; she just thinks that it is a mystery what such a story could be. (ibid.)

This mystery remains, according to Antony, even once van Inwagen's attempted defense of theism is complete. So EAE is a success.

This is a difficult debate to adjudicate. For I myself, just like Louise Antony, van Inwagen, and presumably most of you, my readers, am neither rationally ideal nor agnostic with respect either to the question of theism or to the question whether EAE is a success -- and it is, lest we should forget, only the latter question that is directly at stake here. For as van Inwagen reminds us in his reply to Antony's essay (p. 360), his goal is not to convince her or any other atheist that EAE is unsuccessful. Nor, if his argument that EAE is unsuccessful is to be a success by his standards, does van Inwagen need to convince Antony or any other atheist that this is what an audience of ideal agnostics would conclude from these arguments if an atheist respondent got to have her proper say -- for of course Antony is not likely to be convinced of that, just as van Inwagen and I, theists both, are not likely to be convinced that such an audience would be convinced by Antony's presentation of EAE, at least with van Inwagen or some even more ideal theist working to prevent this. Only God has a real chance of knowing, or at least so I think, what a truly ideal audience would conclude about these matters in the face of truly ideal disputants. If there is a fact of the matter at all, it seems clear enough that we do not know what it is. But let us set this metaphilosophical thread aside for a moment -- I will pick it up again below.

Four of the other five essays in Part III are friendlier to van Inwagen's theism. In 'The Problem of Evil and Atonement', Eleonore Stump discusses the Christian doctrine of atonement, according to which unity or closeness between God and human beings is supposed to heal the 'human tendency to fragmentation' (p. 189) arising from our tendency to both will and fail to will what is good. Frances Howard-Snyder's 'Swing Vote' appeals to a possible worlds account of counterfactual statements in arguing that statements like (S) 'If I had not voted for the superior candidate, that candidate would not have been elected' (see p. 222) can be true even in situations where this candidate had a large margin of victory -- and, by extension, that statements like (G) 'If God had prevented this instance of suffering, the results vis-à-vis His purposes would have been the same' (p. 224), which figure prominently in challenges to the evidential argument from evil, can be true even if the particular instance of suffering in question didn't make the difference between achieving God's purposes and failing to do so.[1] Finally (and stepping out of order for a moment), in 'The Evolutionary Argument for Atheism' Daniel Howard-Snyder criticizes an argument from Paul Draper (1997/2008) that Darwinian evolution provides evidence against theistic religion, and Lynne Rudder Baker in 'Must Anselm Be Interpreted as a Meinongian?' presents a version of St. Anselm's ontological argument for God's existence that in her view 'is sound, is non-question-begging, and avoids any Meinongian ontology' (p. 263).

The other essay in Part III, Alex Rosenberg's 'Theism and Allism', takes on van Inwagen's argument for the compatibility of theism and Darwinism in 'Weak Darwinism' (2009) and 'The Place of Chance in a World Sustained by God' (1988). Against van Inwagen, Rosenberg argues that (1) the second law of thermodynamics prohibits any non-random source of adaptation in our universe, and (2) Darwinian processes depend on the existence of objective chance -- an assumption which 'is not compatible with the existence of an omnipotent, omniscient, benevolent being who intended the existence of our species or its particular members and took steps to achieve this outcome' (p. 238). Van Inwagen responds, in his 'Concluding Meditation', against (1) that it is indeed possible for local concentrations of order to arise in the universe non-randomly but in accordance with the second law, and against (2) that the assumption of objective chance is arguably incompatible with Rosenberg's own assumption of strict causal determinism, but that if these two assumptions are compatible, there is no good reason to think that God couldn't have created a universe in which they both hold.

I, for one, found van Inwagen's response to Rosenberg entirely compelling -- but of course that is how I would find it, for reasons of personal non-neutrality and imperfect rationality that I would hardly pretend to deny. The essays in Part IV: Method concern what the upshot is of such a situation, focusing in particular on the account of philosophical failure and success developed in Lecture 3 of The Problem of Evil. In 'Why Isn't There More Progress in Philosophy?', David J. Chalmers considers some possible explanations of the lack of convergence among philosophers' answers to the 'big questions' in our discipline. Keller's 'Philosophical Individualism', another of the volume's highlights, challenges van Inwagen's claim that success in philosophy should be construed as an 'objective' or public matter, proposing instead that the success of a philosophical argument should be understood in terms of its effects on particular reasoners -- specifically, on the version of his thesis that Keller recommends, in terms of whether a given reasoner knows that argument to be sound. And in 'Are There Any Successful Philosophical Arguments?', Thomas Kelly and Sarah McGrath consider whether it is true that, as van Inwagen has argued, there aren't any (or many) successful philosophical arguments for (as he calls them) substantive conclusions -- a position which, if it is true, would give us advance reason for thinking that any such argument, including, e.g., the evidential argument from evil, will probably turn out to fail.

There were many points at which this talk of philosophical 'success' and 'progress' had me feeling a bit frustrated, since, as I'm sure that neither van Inwagen nor any of the other contributors would deny, there are lots of things that philosophers aim to do other than propose, consider, and attempt to rebut arguments for philosophical theses. In addition to such paradigmatically 'analytic' activities as clarifying concepts, posing questions, making distinctions, articulating positions, drawing implications, imagining hypotheticals, and mapping conceptual space, philosophers also read, translate, and interpret philosophical texts, describe and critique practices of scientific inquiry, lay bare the presuppositions of social practices, and reveal that certain popular and respectable words and phrases are really just dressed-up nonsense. All these things can be done with more or less success, and at least some of our successes seem to accrue in the form of local philosophical progress -- progress that often leads to a degree of agreement among the relevant specialists, but which it would usually be ludicrous to characterize in terms of convergence on propositional attitudes that might stand or fall with arguments offered for them. By my lights there are many instances of these other forms of philosophical success throughout the present volume -- even if all of the arguments in it for substantive conclusions are failures by any reasonable metric.

Another thing that philosophers can fail or succeed in doing is this: modeling for one another what the practice of philosophy should consist in, and thereby bringing one another to do philosophy better. It seems impossible to deny that van Inwagen's work has been an enormous success according to this hardly unimportant criterion. The essays in this volume are sufficient to demonstrate that.


Thanks to John Keller and Angela Schwenkler for valued feedback.


Draper, P. (1997/2008). 'Evolution and the Problem of Evil'. In L. Pojman and M. Rea (eds.), Philosophy of Religion: An Anthology. Wadsworth Press.

Holliday, W.H. (2012). 'Freedom and the Fixity of the Past'. Philosophical Review 121: 179-207.

Van Inwagen, P. (1983). An Essay on Free Will. Oxford University Press.

Van Inwagen, P. (1988). 'The Place of Chance in a World Sustained by God'. In T.V. Morris (ed.), Divine and Human Action: Essays in the Metaphysics of Theism. Cornell University Press.

Van Inwagen, P. (2000). 'Free Will Remains a Mystery'. Philosophical Perspectives 14: 1-19.

Van Inwagen, P. (2006). The Problem of Evil. Oxford University Press.

Van Inwagen, P. (2009). 'Weak Darwinism'. In L. Caruana (ed.), Darwinism and Catholicism. T&T Clark.

Van Inwagen, P. (2010). 'Changing the Past'. In D. Zimmerman (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, vol. 5. Oxford University Press.

[1] I confess that it is hard for me to see how, interpreted in this way, statements like (S) and (G) are relevant to practical deliberation about what to do. In considering, e.g., whether to vote, one’s interest should be in the likelihood that one’s vote will make a difference, and not in what happens in those close possible worlds where one does or does not vote. (Michael Pollan writes somewhere that since people who take vitamins are exceptionally healthy even though vitamins don’t show beneficial effects in randomized control trials (please do your own research before trusting me on this), the best strategy is to be the sort of person who takes vitamins, but not actually go to the trouble and expense of taking them.) This assessment may be infected by my strong suspicion that this whole ‘possible worlds’ business is an instance of philosophical nonsense.