Belief about the Self: A Defense of the Property Theory of Content

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Neil Feit, Belief about the Self: A Defense of the Property Theory of Content, Oxford University Press, 2008, 195pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195341362.

Reviewed by Cara Spencer, Howard University


Beliefs represent the world as being one way rather than another. That is, they have representational contents. The traditional view holds that representational contents are propositions, abstract objects that have their truth-conditions essentially. In Belief about the Self, Neil Feit defends an alternative view about the metaphysical status of belief contents -- that they are properties. In his book, Feit explains what's at issue between the property theory and the proposition theory, gives an able and comprehensive account of the arguments for the property theory and a sensitive and sympathetic treatment of its drawbacks. But more importantly, Feit defends some surprising and unfashionable claims about the property theory -- claims I was inclined to reject before I picked up his book. He argues, for instance, that the proposition theory is incompatible not just with internalism but also with physicalism, and that the property theory is not a mere notational variant of a familiar version of the proposition theory, according to which belief is a three-place relation between a believer, a proposition, and a way of thinking of that proposition. Feit also offers a property-theoretic account of belief de re, which is a refinement of an account given by David Lewis. Finally, he shows us how his version of the property theory can be brought into service to address Kripke's puzzle and defuse arguments for externalism about belief content. Feit's book not only makes substantial new contributions to our understanding of belief about the self and its representational content, but it is also such a model of clear exposition that I would recommend it to those who are just starting to think about these issues.

Feit states the property theory this way:

Property Theory of Content: Necessarily, a subject, S, believes something if and only if there is a property F such that S self-ascribes F. Belief is a dyadic relation -- viz., self-ascription -- between a subject and a property. The content of a belief is the property that the subject self-ascribes. (21)

So for instance, according to the property theory, Fred believes that he has a cold if and only if he self-ascribes a particular property, that of having a cold, which is the content of Fred's belief.

To the uninitiated, the debate between the property theory of content and the proposition theory may seem puzzling: can't we use many different kinds of abstract objects to model different states of affairs? What really hangs on the choice of one type of abstract object, properties, over another, propositions, to serve as the representational contents of our beliefs? Feit's book offers us a clear route out of these sorts of puzzlement, setting out what is at issue in the properties vs. propositions debate and why it matters.

Feit combines the property theory with internalism about belief contents -- the view, in his words, that "our psychological properties supervene locally on our intrinsic, physical properties, in the sense that any two individuals who share all of their intrinsic, physical properties (molecule-for-molecule duplicates) must share all of their psychological properties as well" (21). Feit brings familiar examples into service to show that internalism so-understood is incompatible with the proposition theory. Consider two qualitative duplicates, Hume and Heimson, who, let's say, both believe that they wrote the Treatise. Hume's belief is true, Heimson's false. So their beliefs have different propositional contents. Hence Hume's and Heimson's qualitative properties do not determine the propositional contents of their beliefs, and we as theorists need to choose between the proposition theory and internalism. With the property theory, we don't have to choose. We can say that Hume's and Heimson's beliefs have the same content -- the property of having written the Treatise. (Feit also argues that the property theory's neutrality between externalism and internalism shows that it is a genuine alterative to the proposition theory, and not just a notational variant of it.)

Feit argues that the Hume-Heimson case also shows that the proposition theory is incompatible with physicalism. Suppose that Hume and Heimson are not just qualitatively identical, but also living in physically identical (but numerically distinct, obviously) worlds. Hume believes that he is wise, and Heimson believes that he is. If their beliefs have propositional contents, these contents would have to differ -- Hume's belief is about Hume, and Heimson's about Heimson. Physicalism says that all properties, including psychological properties, supervene on physical properties. So we have a psychological difference without a physical difference and a quick route to the conclusion that the proposition theory is incompatible with physicalism. The property theory tells us that Hume's and Heimson's beliefs have the same content -- the property of being wise. So the property theory can accommodate physicalism. So far so good for the property theorist.

Feit also puts the property theory to work in addressing some of the familiar puzzles about belief, such as Kripke's puzzle. In Kripke's story, Pierre appears to have contradictory beliefs -- he sincerely asserts both that London is pretty and that it is not pretty. If he believes what he says, he believes a contradiction. But as a rational person, Pierre wouldn't let contradictory beliefs pass. Here is Feit's take on things: when Pierre says, "London is not pretty," he expresses a belief whose content is the property of being "London"-acquainted with a city that is not pretty. When he says, "Londres est jolie," he expresses a belief with a different content: the property of being "Londres"-acquainted with a city that is pretty. Feit then uses a familiar move from any philosopher's playbook: defuse a problem by identifying an equivocation on which it rests. Beliefs are contradictory in the weaker sense if they ascribe conflicting properties to a single object, and contradictory in the stronger sense if they are self-ascriptions of conflicting properties. Feit argues that Pierre's rationality only forbids him from having contradictory beliefs in the stronger sense, but in Kripke's story, he only has contradictory beliefs in the weaker sense, since he ascribes conflicting properties to London, and not to himself.

Feit also appeals to the property theory to defuse familiar arguments for externalism about belief content. Externalists point to Oscar, an earthling who believes that water is wet, and his internal duplicate on Twin Earth, Twin Oscar, who believes that XYZ is wet, to show that the contents of our beliefs are not determined entirely by our internal states. If they were, Oscar's beliefs would have the same content as Twin Oscar's, but it's intuitively clear that they do not. Feit accepts the externalist's observation that Oscar believes that water is wet but Twin Oscar doesn't, but denies that it follows that Oscar and Twin Oscar do not share all of their beliefs. According to Feit, Oscar's belief that water is wet and Twin Oscar's belief that XYZ is wet have the same property as their content -- the property of being "water"-acquainted with something wet. Oscar and Twin Oscar are “water”- acquainted with different things, but that doesn't mean that their beliefs differ in content. On Feit's view, the objects they are acquainted with aren't part of the content of their beliefs.

If you've read this far, I think you should have a look at Feit's book. If there is any more complete and resourceful defense of an internalist version of the property theory, I'm not aware of it. That said, I have two reservations. The first one concerns the metaphysical underpinnings of Feit's property theory. Feit is mainly concerned with questions on the epistemological side of the philosophy of mind and language, questions that start from the facts about the roles propositional attitudes play in explaining behavior and in reasoning, and move on to consider which model of attitude content is best suited to explain these facts. But the difference between the property theory and its main rival, the proposition theory, is a metaphysical one -- the difference between one kind of abstract object and another. So one thing we might expect to see is a clear account of the differences between propositions and properties, and a story about why properties, so-understood, are better suited to the epistemological tasks Feit wants to put them to. As an internalist, Feit is clear about what self-ascribable properties can't be -- they cannot contain or entail individual objects or individual essences (23). This commitment is apparent in his solution to Kripke's puzzle as well as his reply to the externalist. In believing that water is wet, Oscar does not self-ascribe the property of inhabiting a world in which water is wet. Rather, he self-ascribes the property of standing in a certain relation of acquaintance, "water"-acquaintance, with something wet. And when Pierre says, "London is not pretty," he self-ascribes the property of standing in a different relation of acquaintance, "London"-acquaintance, to a city that is not pretty. So according to Feit, properties sometimes include relations of acquaintance as constituents. But what is a relation of acquaintance? Feit's talk of "water"-acquaintance and "London"-acquaintance suggests that they include, or at least are individuated by, words or concepts. But the words "water" and "London" are objects too, so if the properties we self-ascribe can't include individual objects or essences, as Feit insists, then they can't include words either. And concepts, even more so than words, are creatures of metaphysical mystery. The question I'm raising here is probably a familiar one: what kinds of objects can narrow contents be? Feit has something to say about what they could not be. Still, I finished his book wishing that I knew more about what he thinks self-ascribable properties are, as opposed to what they are not.

My second reservation concerns Feit's controversial position that the proposition theory is incompatible with physicalism. The Hume-Heimson example is supposed to show that physical duplicates can have beliefs that differ in propositional content -- Hume's "I"-beliefs are about Hume, and Heimson's about Heimson. But physicalism doesn't allow a psychological difference, in this case a difference in the contents of Hume's and Heimson's beliefs, without a physical difference. So much the worse for the proposition theory, Feit concludes. I think this is a bit too quick. Hume has at least one property Heimson definitely doesn't have -- the property of being identical to Hume. This isn't a qualitative property. But is it a physical property, or one that supervenes on the physical? If it isn't, physicalism is false for the simple reason that everything x has the property of being identical to x. A denial of this sort of physicalism doesn't commit us to metaphysically outré features of reality like immaterial souls or nonphysical properties. It just commits us to the commonplace that each thing is identical to itself and no other thing. If physicalism, so-understood, is false, then it doesn't matter that the proposition theory conflicts with it. If, on the other hand, being identical to Hume is a physical property, then Hume and Heimson will turn out to differ in their physical properties, thus physicalism can allow that they will also differ in their psychological properties. Although I think Feit is right that we have many reasons to prefer the property theory to the proposition theory, I disagree with him that this is one of them.[1]

[1] Many thanks to Neil Feit for very helpful discussion.