Better Humans?: Understanding the Enhancement Project

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Michael Hauskeller, Better Humans?: Understanding the Enhancement Project, Acumen, 2013, 212pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9871844655571.

Reviewed by Jonny Anomaly, Duke University


As its title suggests, Michael Hauskeller's book takes a skeptical look at our ability to use biomedical technology to improve our lives by altering our mental and physical capacities. Hauskeller is not a religious conservative who worries about taunting the gods by taking evolution into our own hands. Instead, he criticizes "the enhancement project" from a broadly secular humanist perspective. Indeed, the main virtue of Better Humans? is Hauskeller's attempt to understand and explain what often look like religious arguments against enhancement in terms that are more tangible and less spiritual. Unfortunately, the arguments are almost entirely negative, and by the end of the book the reader is left with the vague sense that we really ought to just accept what nature has given us, no matter how paltry or unfair, and stop dreaming of better things to come.

In the first two chapters, Hauskeller makes two broad claims: first, there is no such thing as better people, only people that are better at performing certain tasks, or who have greater capacities to do so; second, enhancing some widely valued capacities may decrease rather than increase our subjective wellbeing. Hauskeller thinks the first claim follows from the fact that different people value different personality traits, and because enhancing one capacity may diminish another. For example, using pharmaceuticals or genetic engineering to enhance my baseline level of compassion may make me a less cheerful person, since I'll be more prone to see and sympathize with suffering (p. 9). To the extent that cheerful optimism and profound sympathy are both valuable character traits, if there is a trade-off between them, we may not be able to enhance both simultaneously. In support of the view that enhancements may not increase our subjective well-being, Hauskeller notes that increasing general cognitive abilities like memory or impulse control may make us less happy if it also makes us less capable of being moved by emotions that are, to some extent, valuable because they are beyond our control (pp. 10-12).

So far, so good. But the rhetorical questions Hauskeller asks -- Is control always good? and Who would want to remember every detail of their lives? -- are exactly the kinds of questions that thoughtful proponents of enhancement already ask. The fact that increasing our motivation or memory may produce some unwanted side-effects, like anxiety or painful recollections of failed relationships (p. 28), does not imply that it is worse for us, all things considered. Having more motivation or a greater ability to understand and control the world would clearly benefit some people, while others would probably be better off with a greater ability to relax and take satisfaction in past accomplishments. But this suggests the fairly uncontroversial view that using biomedical technology to enhance ourselves will -- like other kinds of medicine -- force us to weigh risks and rewards, including trade-offs between traits that we value, and to think about the package of products we would most prefer to have,[1] subject to some of the constraints Hauskeller emphasizes.

The third chapter is devoted to a hot topic in bioethics: moral enhancement. Julian Savulescu and Ingmar Persson have recently argued that we face an increasing number of large-scale collective action problems that human psychology is ill-equipped to deal with.[2] Although people evolved under conditions requiring strong reciprocity,[3] or within-group altruism, it may be difficult to extend these dispositions so that we care about distant people, including those not yet born. Thus, Savulescu and Persson think, collective action problems ranging from climate change mitigation to the preservation of biodiversity may go unsolved unless we increase our capacity to identify with others and to make personal sacrifices to help them.

Hauskeller is not convinced, for at least two reasons. First, he argues that manipulating certain hormones and neurotransmitters can increase our sense of fairness, but it may adversely affect other parts of our behavior, or lead to collectively undesirable consequences unless everyone is similarly enhanced. For example, spraying a room with oxytocin before volunteers play the ultimatum game leads proposers to make more generous offers, and responders to accept lower offers.[4] Hauskeller mentions a study suggesting that selective serotonin reuptake inhibitors, or SSRIs, may have similar effects (pp. 45-46). Assuming this is true, moral enhancement is a double-edged sword, since, if only part of the population increases its generosity, cooperation can unravel as stingy people exploit more generous "suckers."[5]

Hauskeller's second argument is that attempts to engineer morally better people would undermine free choice:

the very fact that we would be engineered to feel and think a certain way would deprive us of our humanity and turn us into mere puppets hanging from strings that are being moved by those who have decided not only that we are in need of enhancement, but also what enhancement we are subjected to. We would lack freedom not so much because we were incapable of evil, but rather because others . . . would have decided for us what is evil and what is not and would then have programmed us accordingly. (p. 51)

This is a more provocative but less plausible critique of moral enhancement. The problem is that Hauskeller is describing the condition we already find ourselves in: we are "engineered" by our biochemical nature to have certain moral dispositions and to act accordingly. It seems strange to think that deliberately manipulating what evolution has bequeathed us would somehow remove rather than increase our ability to act according to our wishes, and I suspect this is yet another call for caution rather than a decisive argument against moral enhancement.

Most of the middle chapters cover aesthetic enhancement and survey the philosophical terrain without attempting to stake out new ground. The exception is chapter six, where Hauskeller criticizes the quest for immortality, or radical life extension. He begins by usefully distinguishing the question of whether death is an evil from whether extending life is desirable. On the first question, Hauskelleragrees with Epicurus that if death is simply the absence of consciousness, it is neither good nor bad. But on the second question, he challenges the argument that extending our lives would be a good thing on net. Hauskeller's first argument against life extension is not especially compelling. He invokes Kant's Formula of Universal Law and says that a Kantian should conclude that life extension is immoral if we cannot -- under conditions of resource scarcity and a growing population -- universalize the maxim "if we can abolish death, we will do so" (p. 96). However, this is a misapplication of Kant's categorical imperative. In order to test whether a maxim can be universalized we need to formulate the purpose of our action (a "maxim" is a principle of action, not just an action description), and stipulate the relevant empirical conditions. For example, we can easily universalize the following maxim: "I will use biomedical technology to extend my life, provided resources are sufficiently abundant." If everyone followed this principle, life extension would be permissible in conditions of resource abundance, and impermissible in conditions of extreme scarcity. But the maxim itself isuniversalizable, given the proviso about resource scarcity.

A more interesting argument against life extension is the argument from boredom. Suppose we could live both longer and better lives. Over time, Hauskeller thinks the number and quality of new experiences will likely decline since "we cannot endlessly continue looking upon the world with fresh eyes" (p. 105). This is a deep problem, and it remains an open question whether we could also engineer ourselves to be able to take enough delight in new experiences and activities to continue wanting to go on living forever. Still, many of us would like the opportunity to try, and, as Hauskellerconcedes, suicide is always an option.

Near the end of the book, Hauskeller tries to interpret and -- to some extent -- defend Michael Sandel's view that we should accept life as a gift and resist the temptation to enhance ourselves. WhileHauskeller does a nice job of dissecting Sandel's view and clarifying the many ways in which we might understand what it means to accept something as a gift, his task in this chapter is quixotic sinceSandel's view cannot be defended without appealing to dubious religious assumptions. As other commentators have pointed out, it is difficult to describe nature as giving us "gifts" without anthropomorphizing it, or ascribing intentions to the pointless process that is evolution by natural selection. Richard Dawkins reminds us that nature, or natural selection, does not "give" organisms anything; it is simply a process by which combinations of genes that are relatively bad at replicating themselves in particular environments are sifted out[6] (the fact that words like "selection" and "sifted" are used to describe the process shows how deeply teleological our language is, but what we really mean is simply that some combinations of genes will leave more copies of themselves in certain environments than alternative combinations of genes).

The fact that any of us exist at all seems improbable given the enormous number of different combinations of molecules that might have occurred since the Big Bang. This can create a powerful feeling of awe. But gratitude toward the universe is misplaced unless the universe (or God) intentionally created us, and did so in order to benefit us. Hauskeller denies this, and wants to expand "gratitude" to cover something like an emotion of gladness about the fact that we exist, that we are healthy (if we are), and so on. He insists that even in a secular context "our gratitude for being alive is not merely a derivative or metaphorical kind of gratitude" (175). I do not want to quibble, since we can stipulate any meaning we like. But Sandel's argument loses all force when we interpret it to mean that we should be glad about the fact that we're alive. Gladness at being alive says nothing at all about whether we should use our powers to improve our lives, either indirectly through education, exercise, and nutrition, or directly by manipulating our biochemistry and our genes.

In the end, the same objections that apply to Sandel also apply to Hauskeller. But defenders of enhancement will welcome the many critical questions Hauskeller asks about our ability to use biomedical technology to improve our lives.

[1] Buchanan, Allen, Beyond Humanity? The Ethics of Biomedical Enhancement, Oxford University Press, 2011.

[2] Persson, Ingmar and Savulescu, Julian. Unfit for the Future: The Need for Moral Enhancement, Oxford University Press, 2012.

[3] Gintis, Herbert and Bowles, Samuel. "The Evolutionary Basis of Collective Action," In The Oxford Handbook of Political Economy, (pp. 951-67). Oxford University Press, 2008.

[4] Zak, Paul. "The Neurobiology of Trust," Scientific American, May 19, 2008.

[5] Axelrod, Robert. The Evolution of Cooperation, revised edition. Basic Books, 2006.

[6] Dawkins, Richard, The Selfish Gene. Oxford University Press, 2006.