Between Ecstasy and Truth: Interpretations of Greek Poetics from Homer to Longinus

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Stephen Halliwell, Between Ecstasy and Truth: Interpretations of Greek Poetics from Homer to Longinus, Oxford University Press, 2012, 419pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199570560.

Reviewed by Andrew Ford, Princeton University


What is poetry for? This fundamental question begins Stephen Halliwell's probing overview of the ancient Greek critical tradition. In seven substantial chapters he puts the question to texts ranging from the Iliad to On the Sublime, visiting along the way poets, historians and rhetoricians as well as philosophers. His conclusion is that Greek thinking about poetry tended to locate its purpose in a shifting middle ground between arousing an enchanting, self-contained pleasure that calls for no interpretation and inviting an imaginative and emotional absorption in fiction leading to a more lasting benefit, an "enlarged grasp of reality" that can help us live in the world. From the earliest poets' remarks about poetry through the formalized poetics of Aristotle and his successors, Greek views of poetry can be placed on a spectrum "between ecstasy and truth," with some (Aristotle, Gorgias, Longinus) working to synthesize the two values while others (Aristophanes, Isocrates, Plato and Philodemus) leave the tensions between them unresolved.

As a title, Between Ecstasy and Truth may ring a little awkwardly to the ear as compared with, say, The Agony and the Ecstasy; it is not easy to visualize a continuum with a state of mind on one end and a state of being on the other. They are also chronologically ill-matched -- "truth" being claimed by a poet as early as Hesiod, while it may be Plato who is responsible for the picture of a frenzied poet communicating his ecstasy to his hearers. But Halliwell chooses his terms to underscore his contention that we have to do not with a simple and clear-cut opposition, as between pleasure and edification or form and content. Ecstasy and truth are distinct, logically independent paradigms of poetic value that need not conflict and may interact dialectically. Halliwell's analyses accordingly ask of each text whether ecstasy might be in some way a conduit to truth and truth part of the content of ecstasy.

A sense of the overall stakes involved can be given by recalling two of his earlier books, to which the present work may be seen as a capstone. Halliwell established himself as a leading interpreter of Aristotle's Poetics in his 1986 book of that title, which changed how that work was seen. On the understanding prevailing at the time, Aristotle thought the telos of tragic poetry, the proper end of that form, was to give pleasure by providing an outlet for noxious emotions, a harmless emotional indulgence named katharsis according to Jacob Bernays, Freud's uncle by marriage. Along with others working on the Poetics in the 1980's (such as Malcolm Heath, Richard Janko and Martha Nussbaum), Halliwell argued that Aristotle saw tragedy as providing a richer and more constructive experience that improved the soul: the pity and fear elicited by tragedy are not mere "frissons" of feeling but part of an integrated response that includes moral judgment upon representations of human ethical experience.

This "cognitivist" interpretation (so called by Jonathan Lear in an important dissenting analysis) made it no longer possible to characterize the Poetics as an essentially formalist or structuralist account of poetry. Halliwell extended the approach in a 2002 survey, The Aesthetics of Mimesis: Ancient Texts and Modern Problems. Here he argued that the critical term mimesis, central in different ways to both Platonic and Aristotelian conceptions of poetry, endured so long in the Western critical tradition because, despite its ambiguities, it served as a nexus on which converged fundamental issues for any theory of art (not excluding our own). Once again, an old simplistic conception -- taking mimesis essentially as "copying" -- was replaced by a more complex and positive view that saw in art not only a "world-reflecting" function but a "world-creating" one. This called on criticism to take a more dialectical view of poetry's workings, balancing a work's "artifactuality" (often the sole concern of postmodern reading) with its human, and so ethical, content.

In this perspective, Halliwell's new book may be said to add complexity and nuance to longstanding concerns. One might have carried away from earlier work an image of tragedy as drilling an audience in moral syllogisms, but poetic truth embraces a wider variety of ways we can know the world, and poetic form does more than reinforce a poem's truth but is an integral part of the way that truth is experienced. In the view Halliwell extracts from his texts, there is a "quintessentially poetic apprehension of truth" in which poems are appreciated both as objects in their own right and as images of possible realities that call on their audiences to recognize and understand something about the world.

Halliwell's is certainly a subtle and humane defense of poetry, and not without relevance. (The recent mass murder at a showing of a violent movie in Aurora, Colorado, exposed tensions between a popularly promulgated "outlet" theory about cinema as harmless entertainment and concerns about the effects of violent representations on their consumers.) To agree that his terms can focalize important issues in ancient criticism it is sufficient to point to Aristophanes' Frogs and the character Dionysus, who acutely embodies the tension between a predilection for exquisite but empty poetic language and a worry about the kind of citizens a diet of such verse would produce. But the claim that this is a deep, virtually primordial dialectic in Greek culture, rather than a conflict within classical views, depends on whether one is persuaded that Homer and Hesiod, for example, really looked at things the way he says they did. To put it this way may seem to invite a discredited intentionalism and an old-fashioned history of ideas, but it is really an inescapable hermeneutic question. Halliwell tends to regard his authors as philosophers and sees his task as unpacking the "condensed reasoning" of their texts. He does this as astutely and scrupulously as any scholar of ancient views of poetry; the obvious risk, of course, is that he may impose a modern view of aesthetic experience, post-classical and post-Romantic, on texts with different interests and emphases.

Readers may disagree in individual cases about whether his authors would have recognized or wished to defend the positions he extracts from them. Whether one agrees or not, one will find Halliwell's arguments closely reasoned, comprehensively informed and clear; nor does he conceal it when following a chain of implications leads him rather far out on a limb. He also engages in detail with the secondary literature on these much discussed texts; a steady stream of footnotes sets out opposing interpretations with pithy characterizations ("misconceived," "baffling," "misguided," "overstated but interesting") that leave no doubt where Halliwell stands.

But a larger challenge that may be put to Halliwell (and others who work in this way) is to say that the logical implications of a text tell only part of the story, and that to weigh and appreciate any claim about poetry it is necessary to consider it as an embodied, socially situated proposition. An example may be taken from his reading of the Helen by Gorgias, a thinker most scholars would place at the ecstatic extreme, citing his On Not Being (not discussed by Halliwell) as evidence that his commitment to truth was, at best, wavering. Halliwell rather sees Gorgias as seeking a balance between "psychagogy" (a term much used in the ancient sources about him) and truth. But to find a concern for truth in the Helen requires leaning heavily on its opening sentence: "Kosmos for a city is the strength of its men, for a body beauty, for a soul wisdom, for an action excellence [aretê], for a speech truth." Halliwell is at pains to rule out any sense of "adornment" in kosmos, since it seems to be a condition of these objects when they are well (and attractively) ordered rather than being an extra, added quality. He thus ascribes to Gorgias the surprising claim that language is in its best condition when it embodies truth (267-8). The logic is unimpeachable, but in choosing kosmos for his keynote (rather than, e.g., "excellence," aretê), Gorgias has put in play a polyvalent word often used in aesthetic appreciation, and his ostentatious application of it to a variety of objects (including bodies) might suggest the contrary implication that truth is the "artful arrangement" of logos; this would fit the sophist's later contention (§ 13) that philosophers, astronomers, or jurors operate in areas where humans cannot know the truth but believe what logos makes them believe.

The disagreement here is not over the semantics of kosmos but whether to read the opening flourish as Halliwell does, as a thoroughly considered, binding aesthetic pronouncement, or to take it as a jeu d'ésprit, in line with the text's concluding self-description as Gorgias' "toy" (paignion). To settle it by preferring the version that is more reasonable and more interesting in its logical entailments is to beg the question. To take one more micro-example: Halliwell valuably highlights terms running through classical criticism for the "benefit" (ôpheleia, etc.) conferred by poetry, and spends pages analyzing the kinds of benefit poetry might be thought to confer (311 ff.). But reading Aristophanes alongside Plato can show that the language of benefaction often served as well as a euphemism to disguise the (somewhat scandalous) fact of taking money for teaching. In other words, the model of poets as benefactors of the human race not only embodies a congenial theory of poetry but also mirrors the image of "service" that sophists wished to communicate to clients.

For this reviewer, then, the dialectic between ecstasy and truth is missing a social history. The idea that poetry imparts a kind of truth, for example, sounds like a theory promoted by teachers. (It is notable that many of Halliwell's figures are teachers or, like Aristophanes, parodists of teachers.) The conclusion is suggested not simply by asking cui bono? -- establishing Homer as a teacher establishes the authority of teachers -- but also because it enacts the common pattern of a critic projecting onto a text as its dynamics his or her own relation to that text. For Strabo the geographer, Homer was a geographer; for teachers, he teaches. And while such a claim may gain purchase beyond the circle of professional teachers and their clients (as is suggested by Plato's complaint in Republic 10 that "thousands upon thousands" of people believe that Homer teaches one how to live one's life), for all that, it remains no less a position whose underpinnings are as much social as logical.

On the other hand, attention to the social roles of ecstasy can make Halliwell's insights more fruitful. Recent work on Greek poetry as performance may suggest that his penchant for treating ecstasy in dialectic with truth underplays the force of poetry's purely psychagogic powers. Greek tragedy and lyric are now often studied in relation to their institutional settings and physical sites so as to bring out the non-cognitive and sometimes non-verbal ways in which poetry creates meaning for its hearers. Such lines of analysis oppose bookish perspectives on Greek literature by insisting that ritual dynamics in poetic language, gestures, scenery, costumes and "stagecraft" are crucially important constituents of the overall effects of song. Within that context, Halliwell's work is valuable precisely for reasserting that logos was an important element in the sensory fabric. Even though he skims along the philosophical surface of his texts, his readings will be a provocative reminder that we are in dialogue with the talkative Greeks when we ask what poetry is for.