Between Reason and Experience: Essays in Technology and Modernity

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Andrew Feenberg, Between Reason and Experience: Essays in Technology and Modernity, MIT Press, 2010, 257pp., $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262514255.

Reviewed by William Rehg, Saint Louis University


Among philosophers of technology who came of age in the latter half of the twentieth century, Andrew Feenberg counts as one of the most productive and influential. He has developed a capacious theoretical framework, integrating philosophical, historical, and sociological research in a critical theory of technology. Unlike analytic philosophy of technology, which focuses primarily on the nature of technology itself (see Franssen et al. 2010), critical approaches attempt to situate, understand, and assess technology in its relation to culture, politics, society, and the good life. Feenberg is especially remarkable in his capacity to draw on thinkers as diverse as Marx and Heidegger, approaches as opposed as social constructivism and technological determinism, literatures as vast as science and technology studies (STS) and modernity theory, and case studies ranging from Japan to France.

The present volume provides a good overview of Feenberg's work. The nine chapters, drawn in part from earlier publications (some not easily obtained), fall evenly into three parts. The first part places some of the main themes on the table: after opening with a revised version of his 1992 paper on "subversive rationalization" -- a dense presentation of his core critical categories -- Feenberg follows with two chapters that develop implications for environmentalism and explain how to move past dystopian visions. Part two deepens and clarifies his approach with an overview of his synthesis of social constructivism and critique, followed by two cultural studies: the French reception of videotex and the Japanese struggle to embrace modernity, primarily as seen through the eyes of the philosopher Kitaro Nishida. In part three, Feenberg tackles the relation between technology and modernity. The three parts are framed by reactions from two prominent STS scholars, Brian Wynne and Michel Callon.

At the heart of Feenberg's approach lies a distinction that responds to a set of interrelated oppositions. In the history of reflection on technology, a core opposition appears as two contrasting views: technological determinism and social constructivism. The former view, sometimes attributed to Marx but most famously associated with Jacques Ellul, holds that modern technological development follows a "unilinear" logic inherent in functional necessities, which exercise their force independently of society, culture, or politics. Technological progress thus points in one direction that is determined "by the base," i.e., the technical conditions of social reproduction (8). Although determinism can feed utopian visions of the future, the history of technologically mediated oppression continues to feed dystopian views: having made the choice in favor of technological progress, we face an inexorable march into slavery, which we can avoid only by renouncing our choice and returning to a simpler, pastoral society. The sheer implausibility of such a return only deepens the pessimist's despair.

Although determinism still has a hold on the popular imagination, empirical research in STS has largely killed it off among scholars of technology, leaving only its modest offspring, the idea that large technological systems acquire a "momentum" that is not easily reversed, though its precise path and form are socially contingent rather than unilinear (Hughes 1987). As case studies show, technological change involves "interpretive flexibility": new devices typically arrive in competing variants, which mean different things for different user groups and stakeholders (Pinch and Bijker 1987). Thus, technologies we now take for granted as apparently necessary outcomes of functional considerations are in fact social constructions, the result of competing social interests operating on multiple design options.

Feenberg sees a loose alignment of these two philosophies of technological change with two largely disconnected fields of study, technology studies and modernity theory (chap. 7). Modernity theory (Marx, Weber, Habermas, etc.) attempts to understand modern societies in terms of "rationalization," i.e., the rejection of traditional authorities in favor of technical rationality and socioinstitutional differentiation. According to Feenberg, modernity theorists tend toward determinist views of social development when they invoke predetermined "developmental logics" and universal standards of progress -- often seen as more or less realized in Western-style democracies and modern technoscience. Not surprisingly, technology studies -- Feenberg's term for the kind of STS research described above -- aligns with constructivism, generally rejecting universal standards of rational development and the idea of science and technology as a differentiated social sphere characterized by a purely technical rationality.

Feenberg hopes to overcome the above oppositions by developing a framework that recognizes the socially constructed character of technology -- and thus cuts through illusions of a purely functional rationality -- but that also does not shy away from the broad social categories that inform modernity theory and ground critique (class, culture, ideology, etc.). His framework rests on a distinction between functional rationality and social meaning, which he also casts as a distinction between "primary" and "secondary instrumentalization." Whereas determinists and modernity theorists give primacy to the first side of this distinction, constructivists and technology studies emphasize the second. By bringing both sides together, Feenberg hopes to develop a conception of technological progress responsive to democratic criticism and intervention. The difficulty of this task becomes apparent by the last chapter.

To understand Feenberg's distinction, begin with the idea that technological artifacts are functionally rational insofar as their design exploits causal properties of the available materials for the purposes of accomplishing some purpose. Once the purpose or function is given, a design is more or less rational according to how efficiently it allows the user to accomplish that purpose with the available materials. The social meaning of a technological device refers to the broader social context and cultural horizon: how users and other members of the group understand or interpret it and its place in their lives, whether they regard it as ugly or beautiful, a status symbol or sign of poverty, and so on. On one view, functional efficiency enjoys a kind of objectivity that social meaning lacks. Whereas the design objectively exists as a physical arrangement of parts whose operation produces a measurable output or result, social meanings are subjective evaluations, extrinsic to functionality.

Feenberg rejects this bifurcated view, arguing that functional rationality and social meaning, primary and secondary instrumentalization, are only analytically distinct, two "inextricably intertwined dimensions of technology" (18). This is not to deny that technologies operate according to objective physical laws. Rather, the point is that once a purpose and materials are given, physical laws alone do not fully determine rational design. As embedded in social practices, human purposes are typically complex, surrounded by various attendant desires and aims. Consider a very simple artifact, clothing (176). If we take its core function as protecting our bodies from the elements, then its other purposes -- to conceal our nakedness, to communicate social status, etc. -- apparently devolve on a social meaning extrinsic to its core function. But notice that even the bare function of protection is insufficient for assessing the functional rationality of a particular set of clothes. For one, how much protection one requires depends on the wider material and technological context. Adequate protection in nineteenth-century Britain, where houses were poorly heated and transportation was largely by horseback or carriage, differs from such protection today, when we can dart from comfortable buildings into well-heated automobiles. Meeting the functional demand of protection, then, depends to some extent on a dimension of social meaning that Feenberg calls "systematization," the way that technological artifacts tend to operate in broader material and environmental contexts, which affect the functional rationality of artifacts (73, 171).

The other purposes of clothing -- concealing nakedness, communicating status and social occasion, etc. -- are even more clearly saturated with social meaning, given their value-laden character. Feenberg calls this dimension of social meaning "valuative mediation" (73, 171). To claim that functional rationality and social meaning, primary and secondary instrumentalization, are only analytically distinct is to claim that one cannot understand, let alone assess, the former without situating it in broader contexts constituted by systematization and valuative mediation. Whether an outfit "works," for example, is just as much (or more!) a matter of its social acceptability as of its warmth.

To be sure, one might object that once the more complex purpose is fully specified, then functionally rational design follows along purely objective lines set by the available materials and physical necessities. But this objection actually grants Feenberg's point, which is not to dissolve functionality altogether but to insist on its dependence on social meaning. Once social meaning is fully specified, functional aspects appear as technically necessary. But such necessity holds only insofar as one abstracts from the contingencies that characterize social meaning. Feenberg supports this general claim with a number of convincing examples. For example, some features of boiler design which we now take for granted as functionally rational first appeared in response to changing social attitudes toward risk. And today's industrial machinery is designed for adult workers in response to social values we now take as obvious: we no longer consider ourselves the kind of people who would "supplement the family budget by sending our children out to work in a factory" (43). But when child labor was originally abolished, opponents vehemently objected, citing the disastrous effects of retooling on rational production (38-40).

Feenberg's core analytic distinction opens the way for a constructive critique of technology. Such critique starts by analyzing technologies for their "technical code" and its "bias" toward a particular system of hegemony, a "distribution of social power" that is taken for granted, built into the culture, its practices and technology (16, 21, 68). At a basic level, a technical code is simply the technical and regulatory standards that define what counts as proper design in a particular society. Critique attempts to uncover the (often implicit) social and cultural meanings incorporated into the code, for example, how a boiler design presupposes a particular attitude toward risk and liability, how industrial machines assume a conception of children as producers, or how older building codes reflect (and sustain) the marginalization of handicapped persons (an example from Winner 1986). In each of the examples, the functional rationality of the design itself unfairly favors one group or disadvantages another.

Once one sees that a particular technology is not determined by functional necessities alone but also by contingent social assumptions, critique becomes constructive: one can begin to imagine more inclusive alternatives, thus a more "democratic" technology. What does Feenberg mean by this? His examples of democratic intervention tend to favor spontaneous exercises of agency from below, cases in which users took it upon themselves to modify and co-opt devices for their own purposes. One of his favorite examples is the early reception of videotex devices ("Minitels") in France, when a computer system introduced by civil authorities to disseminate information was transformed by hackers into a popular messaging device (chap. 5). Although the Minitel's success depended on the actions of authorities and companies who saw to its wide distribution, a crucial moment involved an exercise of agency from below.

However, as a philosopher steeped in the critical theory tradition from Marx to Habermas, Feenberg is well aware of the limited reach of sporadic local interventions. For how can agency from below match the power of corporations, whose influence saturates mass media, political leadership, and daily consumer choices? In chapter 8, Feenberg sketches a "rational critique of rationality" that acknowledges this larger context. Drawing on Weber, he characterizes modernity by the unprecedented generalization of "social rationality," the organization of social life and institutions according to the principles of commodification, bureaucratic regulation, and technical efficiency. A plausible critique of technology must demonstrate its effectiveness in the face of this pervasive social rationality. To meet this demand, Feenberg generalizes the distinction between primary and secondary instrumentalization to institutions and social systems (e.g., markets), and he introduces the "design code" as the institutional counterpart to the technical code.

Analyses of the 2008 financial collapse suggest how Feenberg's institutional critique might proceed. A number of commentators have blamed the collapse on the neoliberal design code that took hold in the 1980s. Modern economies require some kind of financial system that serves the basic functions of banking (primary instrumentalization), but the looser regulatory regime of recent decades reflects a particular design code and its social valuations -- of acceptable risk, the nature of free markets, profit and remuneration, and the like (secondary instrumentalization). This code is arguably biased to favor a particular hegemony, namely of the financial sector, whose portion of corporate profits in the United States doubled in one decade to forty percent (see Geoghegan 2009). If, as some contend, this hegemonic development contributes to growing social inequality and decline in public life (e.g., Harvey 2007), then a case exists for constructive democratic intervention. As events demonstrate, however, such intervention must rely on the very political system that supports the neoliberal design code.

The constructive recommendations in the concluding chapter 9 remain somewhat elusive as a response to such institutionally entrenched hegemonies. Reformulating Marcuse's ambiguous ideas for overcoming "one-dimensional" technocratic rationality, Feenberg calls attention to the "two-dimensionality" of everyday experience, whereby we perceive technological changes -- say a new strip mall -- not simply as convenient or profitable but also as problematic for such values as neighborhood integrity and natural beauty. Effective critique requires such perceptions to acquire real social-political force: "technical disciplines and technologies should be constrained by values related not just to profitability but more broadly to human and natural needs recognized in experience and validated in political debate." This in turn presupposes a broad socialist transformation, in effect a new design code: a new model of environment-friendly wealth and "far more extensive regulation based on far more democratic and participatory procedures" (213, 215).

Passages like these hint at a bold vision of social change, at once cultural, political, and technological. Has it any chance against corporate capitalism? Feenberg's oeuvre reveals an enduring confidence that local exercises of agency and resistance, aided by participatory forms of administration, can gather enough momentum to redirect technology and society in surprising ways. Although there may be wisdom in that confidence, it assumes we have not all been thoroughly seduced -- or imprisoned -- by the profitable comforts of consumption.


Franssen, Maarten, Gert-Jan Lokhorst, and Ibo van de Poel. 2010. "Philosophy of Technology." The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2010 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.). Accessed August 16, 2010.

Geoghegan, Thomas. 2009. Infinite debt: How unlimited interest rates destroyed the economy. Harper's Magazine (April): 31-48.

Harvey, David. 2007. Neoliberalism and the city. Studies in Social Justice 1: 2-13.

Hughes, Thomas P. 1987. The evolution of large technological systems. In T. J. Pinch and W. E. Bijker, eds., The Social Construction of Technological Systems. Cambridge: MIT Press. 51-82.

Pinch, Trevor J., and Wiebe E. Bijker. 1987. The social construction of facts and artifacts. In T. J. Pinch and W. E. Bijker, eds., The Social Construction of Technological Systems. Cambridge: MIT Press. 17-50.

Winner, Langdon. 1986. The Whale and the Reactor. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.