Between Two Worlds: A Reading of Descartes's Meditations

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John Carriero, Between Two Worlds: A Reading of Descartes's Meditations, Princeton UP, 2009, 519pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780691135618.

Reviewed by Michael Della Rocca, Yale University



So closely does John Carriero’s fabulously detailed Between Two Worlds adhere to the structure and themes of Descartes’s Meditations that a summary of the topics of Carriero’s book would amount to a summary of the Meditations themselves. And because we’ve all read Descartes’s masterpiece a million times, such a summary is something I will not provide here.

Let me then begin this review by offering instead a sketch of what Carriero’s book is not, of the kinds of interpretations of Descartes that Carriero seeks to get us to reject. I will speak here of the usual view of Descartes, but I don’t mean to imply that any one person holds this view in its entirety. Rather, I simply mean to articulate a collection of theses that are often attributed to Descartes and that Carriero seeks to undermine.

The usual view is that in the Meditations Descartes is obsessed with skeptical arguments of increasingly radical scope, arguments that aim to overturn the foundations of our beliefs and to show that they are all unjustified. In the second Meditation, Descartes begins to emerge from this skeptical abyss with the help of his famous cogito argument, which proves that he exists and also, with the help of the further claim that the mind is transparent to itself, that judgments about the contents of one’s mind are self-justifying whereas claims about existence beyond the mind are not. Thus, on the usual view, Descartes needs to work his way up from foundational beliefs concerning his own mind in order to achieve justified beliefs about the extra-mental world. In other words, on the usual view, Descartes focuses on what Carriero calls the “epistemological surfaces” of things and needs to build a bridge from these surfaces in order to gain access to the epistemically more problematic things themselves (p. 20). On the usual view, then, one purpose of the skeptical doubts is to reveal the epistemically privileged character of the mind itself and its contents, which are available to the mind in consciousness in a way that things outside the mind are not.

Unfortunately, so the usual view develops, Descartes’s radical doubt is so radical that he may not be able legitimately — i.e. with the justification his beliefs require — to build the bridge beyond the epistemological surfaces of things. Despite — or perhaps because of — his treatment of the mind as an epistemic refuge, Descartes is unable to acquire the kind of justification required to build this bridge without illicitly assuming that he has already built this bridge. This is, of course, the traditional problem of the Cartesian Circle that threatens Descartes’s entire epistemological and metaphysical enterprise in the Meditations.

Bracketing this intractable problem — as we must if we want to make progress on other areas of Descartes’s thought — the usual approach is to note that Descartes does offer some arguments for the existence of God in a perhaps futile attempt to show that the veracity of God can underwrite our knowledge of the world. The connections among these arguments for God’s existence (one or perhaps two in the Third Meditation, the ontological argument in the Fifth) are not clear, nor is it, on the usual view, clear why the arguments appear in the order that they do.

After some fascinating and wildly implausible claims in the Fourth Meditation to the effect that belief is a matter of will and in the Fifth Meditation about the nature of body as merely extended, Descartes moves — on the usual view — to an argument for dualism in the Sixth Meditation. Here he attempts to demonstrate that the mind is distinct from the body, though the two somehow interact. This powerful argument proceeds by showing that the mind can exist without the body, and to show this Descartes invokes his earlier skeptical arguments, which in part turned on the possibility that his mind could exist with all its sensations even if his body does not exist and even if no bodies exist at all. So ends the usual view.

The first thing to note — and the first thing Carriero notes — about this sketch is how un-unified it is. The various parts of the Meditations on the usual view do not hang together well: the connection among the skeptical arguments early in the Meditations is unclear, and it’s hard to see what relation these arguments have to the proofs of the existence of God, which themselves seem disconnected from one another and from the subsequent discussions of the will in the Fourth Meditation and of true and immutable natures in the Fifth. The usual view thus portrays much of the Meditations as a baffling philosophical smorgasbord.

This lack of a systematic perspective on the work is, perhaps, the biggest strike against the usual view: other things being equal, we should prefer an elegant and systematic reading of the Meditations to one that is not. Carriero’s guiding contention is that we can achieve this kind of superior purchase on the text by taking seriously and prosecuting thoroughly the single idea that Descartes is driven throughout the Meditations by the desire to engage with scholastic Aristotelianism and, in particular, with the thought of Aquinas, the most influential proponent of scholastic Aristotelianism. As Carriero says,

the broad lines of Thomistic Aristotelianism helped to shape Descartes’s discussion and set the stage for much of his major philosophical innovation — more so than did other forms of Aristotelianism, or other traditions of thought (p. 6).

Such engagement certainly led Descartes to deny fundamental tenets of Aquinas’s approach, but equally, as Carriero stresses, this engagement also led Descartes to adopt central planks of the Thomistic platform. It is Descartes’s encounter with Aquinas that, Carriero argues, provides the key to unlocking many of the puzzles about the Meditations that remain unsolved by previous ways of interpreting Descartes.

The Thomistic slogan against which Descartes primarily sets his sights, according to Carriero, is the famous: "nihil est in intellectu nisi prius fuerit in sensu" (nothing is in the intellect unless it was first in the senses). For Carriero’s Descartes, the intellect comes first: it does not depend, as in Aquinas, for its operation on abstracting information received from the senses. Rather, it is the intellect — not the senses — that puts us in direct contact with objects in the world, and the senses — to the extent that they provide our minds with information about the world — do so only by obscuring the information that the intellect already provides for us. The mind — the intellect — is, for Descartes, by its very nature a way of seeing, a way of getting at the structures present in reality and of grasping the true and immutable natures of things (pp. 16-17). By realizing the priority of the intellect over the senses, by promoting — as Descartes often says — detachment from the senses, Descartes is able not only to reveal the structure of the world, but also and at the same time to reveal the favorable epistemic position we already enjoy.

Because, according to Carriero’s Descartes, we already enjoy direct contact with the structure of reality, his Descartes does not feel the urgency of skeptical problems as acutely as does the Descartes of the usual view. Further, the Cartesian Circle is not a problem that Carriero’s Descartes faces. For Carriero, Descartes is not primarily concerned with the epistemological surfaces of things (p. 21). For Carriero, consciousness and its immediacy are not fundamental to the Cartesian mind. For Carriero, the Cartesian mind does not have better access to the contents of its mind than to the world beyond the mind. Thus Carriero’s Descartes is freed of the (perhaps impossible) burden of building a bridge from the mind to the world, a burden that generated what we can now see as the non-problem of the Cartesian Circle. Carriero thus provides an alternative to a skepticism-based reading of Descartes (p. 3). Of course, as Carriero recognizes, Descartes goes to great lengths to demonstrate God’s veracity, but the purpose of this demonstration is not to give us knowledge of the world beyond our minds. Rather it is to give a reflective view of our already inherently good epistemic standing.

The benefits of Carriero’s reorientation of the Meditations around Descartes’s engagement with Aquinas are substantial. Parts of the text fall into place in new and extremely illuminating ways. Thus Carriero offers a powerful and controversial explanation of the often perplexing analogy between painting and dreams in the First Meditation. In this passage, Carriero argues, Descartes’s meditator surprisingly begins to free herself from the sensory ideology that has shaped her thinking and to see that there are sources of knowledge independent of the senses. Carriero’s methodology of focusing on Cartesian detachment from the senses offers us new insight into the reason that the ontological argument in the Fifth Meditation comes after the cosmological arguments in the Third. As Carriero stresses, before we achieve detachment from the senses, we would not take ourselves to have the grasp of God’s essence that the ontological argument requires as its starting point; God’s essence was thought to be out of the reach of the senses (p. 181). Thus before the ontological argument can make its appearance, Descartes needs to establish that we have an idea of God’s essence that is not derived from the senses (and is, indeed, innate). He does precisely this in his arguments for the existence of God in the Third Meditation. Because Carriero emphasizes Descartes’s view that the mind has access to the essences of things — including God’s essence — Descartes’s often overlooked treatment of true and immutable natures or essences is restored to its rightful place of importance in Descartes’s system. Further, with Carriero’s emphasis on the way the intellect enjoys primacy over sensation and imagination in the economy of the Cartesian mind, we gain a deeper understanding of why, for Descartes, animals — which are devoid of intellect - are thereby also devoid of sensation and imagination (p. 127). Carriero’s account of the importance of detachment from the senses also sheds much-needed light on Descartes’s controversial view that will is essential to judgment:

If we think of Descartes’s aim as the reorientation of one’s cognitive life, which requires undoing the effects of ideology, entrenched by years of custom, it becomes easier to see why he thinks that what he is doing involves the reformation of one’s will (p. 270).

Throughout, Carriero is indefatigable in the care and precision he brings to the analysis of Descartes’s text. Time and again he goes the extra mile in order to wring new and important insights from Descartes’s words in a way that coheres with his overarching and systematic interpretation. Although, of course, Carriero is well-versed in the secondary literature on Descartes, for the most part and in a welcome manner, he confines direct engagement with other scholars to the copious endnotes.

Pushing the secondary literature to the side in this way is in service of Carriero’s goal of “work[ing] through the text as it appears and … confront[ing] it in an unfiltered way” (p. ix). As Carriero states correctly, "most articles on Descartes are organized around themes or topics … and not around the text of the Meditations" (p. 7). I have no qualms about Carriero’s downplaying of the secondary literature (there’s too much of that stuff anyway!) but I do have a general worry about Carriero’s goal of offering an “unfiltered” reading of Descartes’s texts. Without wanting to go all hermeneutical on you, I wonder whether such an unfiltered reading is even possible. Is it really possible to confront the text on its own terms without bringing our preoccupations to it? More specifically and more substantially, I would like to register this reservation: perhaps Carriero’s heavily Thomistically-engaged reading of the Meditations does not provide us with a genuinely unfiltered encounter with the text. The Thomistic perspective is, I would claim, itself a filter on the text. It’s certainly a good and illuminating filter. After all, Aquinas was extremely influential and he obviously shaped Descartes’s thought in many ways. Nevetheless it’s worth noting (as Carriero himself does) that there were loads of other important figures familiar to Descartes, figures in some cases temporally closer to Descartes. In particular, the influence of Suarez on philosophers of Descartes’s time and on Descartes himself was enormous. Of course, Suarez himself was deeply indebted to Aquinas. The Suarezian line of influence (and others), however, may be valuable filters just as the Thomistic filter is valuable.

Further, like any filter, the Thomistic filter leaves some things out or at least obscures them. For example, as I mentioned, Carriero de-emphasizes skeptical argumentation and the significance of consciousness in Descartes’s philosophy of mind. For Carriero, Descartes is not focused on working his way from the epistemological surfaces of things to the things themselves. Rather, for Carriero, Descartes sees perception and cognition as world or object-involving in somewhat the same way that Aquinas did, though of course without the Thomistic view that all thought has its origins in sensation. I agree that Descartes does want to arrive at the view that thought is world-involving in some way. Nevertheless to get to his non-Thomistic version of the Thomistic view that cognition is world-involving, Descartes needs to undermine the view that cognition is based on the senses. To do that, Descartes needs to engage with skeptical arguments that are designed to promote detachment from the senses. Further, to promote this detachment, Descartes seeks to isolate the epistemic surfaces of things and to work his way from these surfaces to the world beyond the mind, a world that we can see at the end — but not before — of this engagement with skepticism is intimately involved in our cognitions. So, on this way of looking at Descartes, Descartes has a kind of Thomistic conclusion — just as Carriero importantly shows us — but Descartes reaches this kind-of Thomistic conclusion by means of a skeptical starting-point centered on the epistemological surfaces of things. This engagement with skepticism is fully compatible with Descartes’s and Carriero’s claim that perception is world-involving; indeed, this engagement makes it possible for Descartes to reach that claim.

There is much evidence — evidence that Carriero must downplay — that Descartes does concern himself in an important way with epistemological surfaces. For example, there is the exchange with Gassendi over whether “I walk therefore I am” would suit Descartes’s purposes in the cogito. There is the discussion of clarity and distinctness in the first part of the Principles. Further, a particularly revealing passage in which Descartes seems to be fundamentally concerned with advancing and rebutting skeptical arguments occurs in the First Meditation itself. There, in summarizing a stretch of that Meditation, Descartes says that his doubt of all his former beliefs “is not a flippant or ill-considered conclusion, but is based on powerful and well thought-out reasons”. Here Descartes explicitly advances the argument of the Meditations by taking skeptical doubts seriously and by providing, in good skeptical fashion, reasons for doubt. Because Carriero doesn’t see Descartes as primarily engaged with skeptical reasoning, Carriero cannot interpret this passage straightforwardly, and thus he treats this claim not as a statement that Descartes has, at this stage, provided reasons to doubt, but as "something of a promissory note, to be redeemed over the course of the Meditations" (p. 45). Here I think that Carriero’s Thomistic filter leads him to offer a strained reading of an important passage.

So what I am suggesting is that Descartes can — and indeed does — have his cake and eat it too. Why can’t it be part of Descartes’s genius to employ a basically epistemological, skeptically-engaged perspective that is in service of what might seem to be the radically opposed and in some respects Thomistic view that cognition is world-involving?

None of this is in criticism of the wonderfully valuable perspective that Carriero provides on the Meditations. Because of its systematic ability to deepen our understanding of every aspect of the Meditations, Between Two Worlds sets the standard for interpretations of the Meditations for the foreseeable future.1

1 Thanks to Anat Schechtman for helpful comments and discussion.