Beyond Blood Identities: Posthumanity in the Twenty-First Century

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Jason D. Hill, Beyond Blood Identities: Posthumanity in the Twenty-First Century, Lexington Books, 2009, 249pp., $30.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780739138434.

Reviewed by Serena Parekh, University of Connecticut



The position argued for in this book — strong cosmopolitanism — is one that will be unfamiliar to many readers. Cosmopolitanism itself is an ancient moral and political theory that holds that all human beings should be thought of as belonging to the same human community; we should all see ourselves as "citizens of the world." This view can be traced back to at least the Stoics, and has been popularized in recent years by people like Martha Nussbaum and Anthony Appiah. The form of cosmopolitanism advocated by these philosophers is referred to by Hill as moderate or weak cosmopolitanism because it does not see itself as being incompatible with the local identities that many people hold on to even while believing in cosmopolitan values. For Nussbaum and Appiah, one can identify as a Muslim or a Tutsi and still believe that the relevant moral group of concern is all humanity.

The strong version of cosmopolitanism put forth by Hill in this book, by contrast, does not share this view. For him, all forms of "tribal" identification (i.e., identity based on culture, race, language, ethnicity, nationality, etc.) are entirely without warrant and should not play any role in our moral or political framework. In Hill’s view, we need to move beyond these forms of identification in order to achieve the goals of cosmopolitanism. We need to see ourselves and each other first and foremost as individuals, without limiting ourselves to narrow forms of group identification. Since most people are raised to see themselves according to "tribal" identifications — as an American, a Jew, Chinese, Sicilian, etc — this position is not intuitively obvious. While I think Hill does a laudable job trying to make this position seem credible and morally desirable, I do not think it is sufficient to overcome the (legitimate) reservations many people will have in giving up cultural, ethnic, or racial identity. Nonetheless, this book is an important contribution to the scholarship on cosmopolitanism and furthers the debate over exactly what form this political and moral philosophy should take.

One of Hill’s central arguments concerns the nature of culture. In his view, multiculturalists and pluralists, not to mention everyday "tribalists" (those who see their identity primarily in terms of their racial, ethnic, national, or cultural identity), have placed far too much importance on preserving culture regardless of the content of the culture. In Hill’s opinion, "cultures that fail to uphold and defend individuals as venerable entities worthy of respect cannot be deserving of respect" (29). Given the dominance of multiculturalism in our contemporary world, it is not often that you hear somebody argue that certain cultures are not worthy of respect. He even argues that what is usually considered akin to a crime against humanity — ethnocide or culture killing — is not really problematic; in fact, in many cases, such as for native Indians, it is desirable. Concerning native or indigenous peoples, he writes, "what is so great about a way of life in which life expectancy is between forty-six to fifty years old and the infant mortality rate is 50 percent?" (92). This line of argument is part of Hill’s strategy to undermine what is normally taken as an unquestionable good — culture and racial/ethnic identification — and to show, consequently, that we ought not to identify primarily with those who share our blood or "tribal" identification.

Yet Hill’s view on culture is more subtle than it may initially appear. While strong cosmopolitans like Hill do not endorse particular cultures just because they are the cultures of a certain group (as multiculturalists and pluralists might), they nonetheless view culture as something important. For Hill, culture is important because it is the "milieu in which we navigate and matriculate morally and socially" (40). Yet for him this does not mean that we ought to protect certain cultures just because they are the cultures of our ancestors. He uses the analogy of language: just as we are hardwired to speak a language, but not a particular language, so we require culture, but not any particular culture. Therefore, we ought to support and promote only cultures that place a high value on individuals since strong cosmopolitans hold that individuals, not groups, are the most important unit of the political landscape.

In this sense, strong cosmopolitans are much closer to liberals than to multiculturalists or pluralists who stress instead the importance of individually demarcated groups/cultures and group identification. Hill’s condemnation of the traditional view of culture is necessary to support his argument that identity ought to be left up to the individual. According to Hill, who we really, truly are cannot be determined by our "blood" identifications but is a matter of individual traits, experiences, beliefs, etc. Hill’s view on culture is ultimately that it is necessary ("No individual, regardless of how she conceives of herself, has ever existed as an atomistic individual apart from the community or society that she lives in," 98), but we need a certain kind of culture in order for the individual to flourish. Culture must be understood as public, open to change and interpretation, and not as an unchanging edifice that individuals must be forced to conform to. By consciously avoiding identifying with the mythological elements of culture (such as the Jews being God’s chosen people, or Italians being a warm, family-centered culture, two mythologies that Hill discusses in his book), we may begin to see individuals as individuals, and not merely tokens of a particular culture or race.

Hill’s view of culture, then, is rather complex. On the one hand, Hill seems to be calling for a quite radical abolition of cultural or ethnic identification as we know it. We need to realize that our "blood identities" are largely fabricated, untenable and morally problematic. Yet on the other hand, he fully acknowledges our reliance on others for the formation of our identity — we need culture as the milieu in which to become individuals and, in order to be fully human, we need to be open to "radical intersubjectivity," "the freedom to be deeply touched by another and to allow the spontaneous gestures and responses that blossom from the encounter to shape a new identity" (118). In other words, there seems to be for Hill a strong dialectic between individuality and communal identification, much as there is in the work of liberal communitarians like Charles Taylor. Hill seems to be aware that while he is arguing that we should move beyond blood identities (as his title indicates), we also need a larger "horizon of significance" (Taylor’s term) in order to make sense of and form our individual identities. In this sense, radical cosmopolitans may have more in common with communitarians than it first appears. Of course the main difference still remains — communitarians value cultures and communities in all their forms, while Hill thinks that the only culture worth embracing is one which has modernized from within and allows a great deal of individual liberty and protection. Yet nonetheless, this dialectic — between our horizons (be they cultural, ethnic, national, international) and our individual identities — complicates matters for the strong cosmopolitan.

The position Hill advocates for in this book is "posthumanism." This is an interesting choice of terms since it stresses how closely connected traditional forms of identification and community are with being human. Yet Hill is confident that we are able to move beyond community understood as constituted by "a shared ethnicity; shared cultural life; shared religion, nationality, and language; as well as a perceived shared ethnoracial identity" (177). If community can and ought no longer to be based on these tribal identifications, yet community remains important to individual flourishing and identity, what form should it take? What form of belonging can replace the exclusionary communities we’ve had in the past? The answer that he gives is sociality and sodality. Sociality is the general sphere of social intercourse, beyond one’s immediate social environment; sodality is "a spirit of camaraderie and friendship" which "captures a feature of the public domain that transcends community" (184). In other words, these spheres are much broader than the spheres that have been traditionally taken to constitute community and they allow one to exercise "creative agency without the hinders of memory — real or imagined — blood, real or imagined, and even the comforting presence of custom and tradition" (184). In this way we are able to achieve the cosmopolitan ideal of "laissez-faire existential engagement" (184). This entails that the very nature of political communities must be constantly negotiated:

socialities and sodalities demand the constant negotiation of borders, the access to borders, and an ongoing investigation of how arbitrary definitions of people grant some an unqualified access to community and others an unfair exclusion from even the margins of community (186).

Politically speaking, strong cosmopolitanism is no easy task.

While this form of engagement sounds appealing in many ways, the moral corollary that Hill sets out makes it much more questionable. For Hill, laissez-faire existential engagement involves "no obligations and responsibilities that the individual has not undertaken for herself" (187). This is because of the stress he puts on individuality — individuals must have a choice to accept or reject the socio-cultural creation of duties and responsibilities. In place of socially imposed duties Hill suggests that we have "the nature of friendship among equals who engage the humanity of each other out of, among other things, the sheer pleasure one gets from engaging the soul of another" (187). The implication of this seems to be that something like apriori human rights, which, by definition, constrain individual behavior regardless of whether individuals accept them or not, would not be part of the strong cosmopolitan framework. This, however, would seem to contradict Hill’s earlier assertion that the only cultures worth accepting are the ones that promote individual rights. Without culturally, socially or politically imposed obligations or duties, it is not clear how we would be able to protect individual rights.

In conclusion, Hill’s rich book provides an engaging line of argument for strong cosmopolitanism that readers will find at times compelling, shocking, audacious, and rousing. Because it challenges so many of our political conceptions, readers will no doubt find themselves in disagreement with him at times. I, for example, found myself wondering if I really agreed with him that tribal or blood identification is indeed the most important source of exclusion in the modern world. In my view, the most radical exclusion today is of refugees, asylum seekers, and internally displaced persons (IDPs) who are shut out of the human community for reasons that have little to do with the kind of tribal belonging that he discusses. In this case, political or national belonging seems to be much more important and this is significantly different from the kind of tribal belonging that Hill is concerned with. Nonetheless, Hill’s book challenged many of my assumptions about cultural, ethnic and racial belonging, and the importance of rootedness in a community. It is for this reason that his book is an important contribution to the ongoing debate over exclusion and belonging in the modern world.