Beyond Comparison: Sex and Discrimination

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Macklem, Timothy, Beyond Comparison: Sex and Discrimination, Cambridge, 2003, 232pp, $26.00 (pbk), ISBN: 0521534151.

Reviewed by Donald Hubin, Ohio State University


It might seem to take more than a little courage for a man to write a book on sex discrimination that contains a section titled, “What it means to be a woman.” If Timothy Macklem’s analysis of the nature of sex discrimination (against women, at least) is correct, though, this is precisely the question we must answer if we are to determine whether women suffer from sex discrimination and, if so, what forms such discrimination takes. Macklem rejects analyses of discrimination against one group that are based on simple comparisons with the resources and opportunities available to another group—hence, his title: Beyond Comparison. On Macklem’s analysis, sex discrimination against women consists of women being misunderstood in such a way as not to be provided with the opportunity to lead a successful life.

There is much of interest in Macklem’s discussion, but potential readers should be warned that it does not provide an “entry point” into the literature on sex discrimination. Nearly one-third of the book is explicitly devoted to describing and analyzing the views of Catharine MacKinnon and Drucilla Cornell, two authors who clearly set the agenda and the landscape for Macklem’s analysis throughout the book. Both authors are important; neither is easy. While Macklem tries to present the views of MacKinnon and Cornell sympathetically and to clarify them prior to criticizing them, he is more successful in achieving the first goal than the second. And Macklem’s presentation of his own views is, in addition to being highly repetitive, almost relentlessly abstract. Concrete illustrations are rare and the reader, especially one new to the literature on sex discrimination, can easily lose track of what, if anything, of practical significance is at stake in the discussion.

Macklem’s thesis is a surprising one. “Nothing in … the] story of discrimination and non-discrimination depends upon a comparison of men to women, one that would describe women as equal to men, or as different from them. Nor would anything in the story be assisted by such a comparison” (p. 11-12). Macklem challenges the idea that the very concept of discrimination, whether employed in a positive, negative or neutral sense, involves comparison. Discrimination in the positive sense involves, he claims, “accurate perception of the value latent in” certain options; discrimination in the negative sense involves the suppression of “the valuable qualities in certain options by presenting in their place an inaccurate, misconceived picture of those options and the value (and lack of value) latent in them” (p. 17). (It is unclear how Macklem would understand discrimination in a neutral sense.) But this is surely to offer an account of what one might like ’discrimination’ to mean rather than what it does mean. The ordinary sense of ’discrimination’, as virtually all dictionaries recognize,1 involves distinguishing and differentiating—two activities that, it would seem, cannot be done without comparison.

The pure definitional issue is of no philosophical importance, of course; it suggests, though, that Macklem might have framed his substantive thesis more perspicuously. He might have pointed to the phenomena we typically refer to as sex discrimination and argued that they are better understood not as matters of discrimination at all but, instead, as instances of improper treatment based on misconceptions concerning the nature a sex.

Can we understand the phenomena we are used to framing as sex discrimination against women as, instead, instances where women’s opportunities to lead a successful life have been unjustifiably diminished because of misconceptions about what it means to be a woman? And, more controversially, can we do this without making comparisons to men? I think not. Suppose we try. Let’s begin by looking at Macklem’s discussion of “what it means to be a woman.” Admiration for Macklem’s courage (some might characterize it as hubris) in discussing this question is diminished a bit when one comes to realize that precious little is given by way of an answer. Almost all of Macklem’s discussion of what it means to be a woman is discussion about the question: why it is possible to answer the question, why it is crucial to answer the question, what form the answer could take, and so forth.

This is not to say that Macklem doesn’t take a stab at answering the question; he does. He begins by noting that “a true understanding of what it means to be a woman…embraces not only the qualities that all women possess but the qualities that only women possess, as well as the qualities that women have a greater tendency to possess than men” (p. 35). He never explains what seems impossible: how can an understanding of what “qualities women have a greater tendency to possess than men” be achieved without comparison with men? Nevertheless, he offers what he sees to be at least part of this understanding. Here is his stab:

So what it means to be a woman in the broad sense is, on the one hand, to be capable, despite what many have claimed, of being a miner or a metalworker, a doctor or a lawyer, a physicist or a mathematician, and the many other things in regard to which the capacities of women cannot be distinguished from those of men. On the other hand, what it means to be a woman in the broad sense is also, in part, to be unlike men, and so to be capable of exercising those capacities that are distinctive to women in the sense I have described. So, what it means to be a woman in the broad sense is also to be capable of bearing children, to be capable of thinking in the special ways that women are said to have made peculiarly their own, to be capable of showing what is said to be a women’s distinctive brand of concern. (p. 35-36)

But this isn’t really much of a stab at all. It’s not very informative to begin with, and a significant part of what it does communicate is, I believe, wrong even by Macklem’s lights. Consider the second part of the account—the respects in which what it means to be a woman is to be unlike men. Ignore the fact that many women are not capable of bearing children; Macklem is well aware of this and thinks it irrelevant to the issue of whether this is a proper part of the understanding of what it means to be a woman. Focus, instead, on the second and third aspects listed. First note that the very descriptions contain an implicit comparison to men. This comparison goes beyond the claim that the second part of what it means to be a woman “is also, in part, to be unlike men.” Macklem would hold that this claim is just a way of introducing other characteristics of women which, in fact, are not shared by men but can, nonetheless, be fully understood without comparison with men. But talk of the capacity to think in the special ways women have made peculiarly their own, as well as talk of women’s distinctive brand of concern, makes sense only in virtue of a comparison to men. Perhaps there is a way to describe these characteristics without reference to men, but Macklem hasn’t managed to do so. Second, note that the claims tell us little about these special, peculiar, distinctive capacities. If women are to be understood through such capacities, it must be possible to go beyond a “je ne sais quoi” description. Third, and more troubling, it’s doubtful that Macklem really means to be referring to “thinking in the special ways that women are said to have made peculiarly their own” and “showing what is said to be a woman’s distinctive brand of concern.” Unless he is playing games and being coy about who is doing the saying, these phrases refer to beliefs that are commonplace in society. But Macklem cannot, on pain of undermining his analysis of the phenomenon of sex discrimination or undermining his claim that women are victims of sex discrimination, hold that we have got it so right about what it means to be a woman. Put the other way, for Macklem to be right about what sex discrimination is and that, in our society, women are victims of such discrimination, it had better turn out that a lot of what is truly involved in what it means to be a woman are capabilities that women are said not to have or, at least, not said to have.

The absence of a more substantive answer to the question of what it means to be a woman is surprising given Macklem’s stunningly strong claim that:

[i]f we are not in agreement as to the character of certain people, and so are not in agreement as to the character of what may disadvantage them, we cannot begin to entertain the question of their disadvantage. (p. 142, emphasis added)3

This claim seems to render the possibility of entertaining the question of disadvantage dubious, to say the least. One wonders how Macklem can confidently declare that women in our society have been disadvantaged by sex discrimination and write an entire book about this discrimination given that there is little agreement on the issue of what it means to be a woman. Perhaps, though, Macklem has simply misstated his point here. Maybe it is not a point about agreement being necessary to entertain a question but a point about the need for a proper understanding of who a group of people are in order to have a proper understanding of their disadvantage. In that case, though, one would think that he would have devoted much more attention to empirical research concerning the nature of women. After all, if our current collective understanding of what it means to be a woman is a misconception, there is, presumably, a fact of this matter. And, we should expect the empirical sciences to give us insight into it. Unfortunately, there is absolutely no attention paid to any empirical research concerning “the qualities that all women possess …[and] the qualities that only women possess, as well as the qualities that women have a greater tendency to possess than men” (p. 35).

I suspect that Macklem had difficulty saying much of substance about what it means to be a woman because there isn’t much to be said beyond trivialities and the reporting of social stereotypes. And, while it is important to understand these stereotypes because of the ways in which they can shape one’s conception of oneself as well as affect the opportunities available, these will not serve the purpose Macklem has in mind. His plausible core thought is this:

As a conceptual matter it is impossible to say that a person is disadvantaged, at least in any meaningful sense, without an idea of what it means to be that person and who he or she is to be contrasted with. (p. 141)

But notice that this thought is expressed at the level of individuals. One can agree that disadvantage is to be understood in relation to what a person needs to lead a successful life and that this depends crucially on what it means to be that person and still think it makes no sense to look for the sort of characteristics that Macklem suggests we look for in understanding what it means to be a woman. For there are few, if any, characteristics that all and only women have that could serve as a basis for determining what a person needs for a successful life. And, if we understand what it means to be a woman in terms of “characteristics they have a greater tendency to posses than men,” how does this help us to understand those women who do not have those characteristics or those men who do? If, for example, there really is a special way of thinking that women are more likely to engage in or a special kind of concern that women have a greater tendency to display, will making these a part of our social understanding of what it means to be a woman enhance the chances for a successful life for those women who do not think in this way or display this concern? Will it help those men who do display these characteristics to lead a successful life? It seems not. Indeed, one wonders why, after rejecting comparison with men as the crucial issue in understanding disadvantage, Macklem seems to insist on understanding an individual woman’s disadvantage in comparison with other women. Why not hold to the conviction that the disadvantage that matters doesn’t really concern the treatment of this individual in relation to other individuals or the nature of this individual in relation to others of some class, in this case sex. Rather, it can be understood and appreciated without any such comparison. It can be understood solely by considering the characteristics of this person and whether this individual is receiving what is necessary for a successful life. But, rare passages like the above notwithstanding, Macklem refuses to go individualistic with his intuition of ensuring that people have access to the resources they need to lead a successful life.

Finally, given that Macklem’s book is nominally about sex and discrimination (and not just discrimination against women), word must be said about Macklem’s disregard of men’s opportunities to lead successful lives. It is not uncommon, of course, for men’s interests to be ignored in discussions of sex discrimination. Insofar as one views sex discrimination as being determined by simple comparisons between the status of men and the status of women, one might try to justify this oversight by arguing that, overall, the status of men is better than that of women. But for someone like Macklem, who holds that the proper understanding of sex discrimination lies “beyond comparison”—and, in particular, lies in a misunderstanding of what it means to be a woman or a man that results in a significant decrease in access to the resources and opportunities necessary for a successful life—such an oversight is less understandable.

Currently, in the United States, men commit suicide at four times the rate of woman. This marked asymmetry, which exists in most Western, industrialized countries, strongly suggests that we have misconceptions about men that interfere with their ability to live successful lives, or to live a life at all. Divorced fathers commit suicide at about 10 times the rate of divorced mothers.3 This startling statistic, considered in conjunction with the fact that divorced fathers are ten times more likely to be declared noncustodial/nonresidential parents of their children, suggests something about the nature of our misconception of what it means to be a male: we have, it appears, misunderstood what it means to be a father and how central to a man’s mental and physical health is his relationship with his children.4 In the academic year 1999-2000, males constituted only 44% of college undergraduates.5 Males are more likely to drop out of high school.6 They make up approximately 2/3 of those in special education classes.7 The academic problems that males face in comparison with females suggests that we do not have an accurate understanding of what it means to be a boy or a young man and that this misunderstanding is severely disadvantaging men in leading successful lives. And if, when evaluating the success of men’s lives, we will but look down to the streets rather than just up to the boardrooms, we will find that these misconceptions of what it means to be a man are, indeed, resulting in many men’s not leading successful lives. Single men are nearly three times as likely to be homeless as single women.8 Males are more than six times as likely to be incarcerated as females and, probably because of longer average incarceration time and higher recidivism rates, more than 93% of current prisoners are male.9 The overwhelming prevalence of males in our prisons suggests that we do not understand what it means to be a man in such a way as to allow these men, disproportionately African-American and Hispanic men, to lead successful lives.

As I indicated, the tendency to ignore the respects in which our society disadvantages men is not new. Macklem’s discussion of sex and discrimination merely continues a long, though shameful, legacy of neglect. But it is especially troubling to see our misconceptions about these matters in the work of a theorist who argues strenuously that we should understand sex discrimination not by merely comparing the sexes but by trying to understand what it means to be a man and what it means to be a woman and evaluating the ways in which people are deprived of what they need to lead successful lives. On this approach, one might have hoped for a more nuanced and sensitive discussion of how our gender misconceptions can disadvantage both men and women than one has come to expect from the crude approach of asking whether men or women are, overall, “doing better.” Unfortunately, these hopes are not realized in Macklem’s book. On the contrary, Macklem confidently pronounces: “in fact there is little evidence that we as a society misunderstand men to an extent that would damage men’s lives” (p. 13). Indeed!


1. One on-line dictionary, MSN Encarta, gives a definition of ’discrimination’ that is close to Macklem’s account of positive discrimination: the “ability to notice and value quality: the ability to appreciate good quality or taste” ( last visited 04/16/2004). In addition to this being a rather unusual definition, this definition won’t make sense of Macklem’s notion the “negative sense” of discrimination, for it is also discrimination, of course.

2. See also p. 154, where Macklem asserts “we must agree on the content of what it means to be a woman in order even to contemplate the question of disadvantage” (emphasis added).

3. See Augustine.J. Kposawa, “Divorce and Suicide Risk,” 57 J. Epidemiology & Cmty. Health (2003); see also C. H. Cantor and P.J. Slater, “Marital Breakdown, Parenthood, and Suicide,” Journal of Family Studies 91, 91-102 (1995).

4. See: Caryl Rivers & Rosalind Barnett, “Fathers Do Best: Why Dedicated Dads are Usually Healthier and Happier,” Washington Post, June 20, 1993, at C5; Rosalind Barnett et al., “Men’s Multiple Roles and Their Relationship to Men’s Psychological Distress,” Journal of Marriage and Family 54 (1992) 358-67.; Rosalind Barnett & Nancy Marshall, “Men, Family Role, Job Role Quality, and Physical Health,” Health Psychology, 1 (1993) 48-55; Deater-Deckard, K., Scarr, S., McCartney, K. & Eisenberg, M. (1994). “Paternal separation anxiety: Relationships with parenting stress, child-rearing attitudes, and maternal anxieties,” Psychological Science, 5, 341-346

5. “Profile of Undergraduates in U.S. Postsecondary Education Institutions: 1999-2000,” Laura Horn, Katharin Peter, and Kathryn Rooney (last visited 4/17/2004).

6. “Percent of High School Dropouts (Status Dropouts) Among persons 16 to 24 Years Old, by Sex and Race/Ethnicity: April 1960 to October 200,” National Center for Education Statistics, (last visited 4/17/2004).

7. Twentieth annual report to Congress on the implementation of the Individuals with Disabilities Education Act, U. S. Department of Education (1998), Washington, DC.

8. “A Status Report on Hunger and Homelessness in America’s Cities: 1998,” U.S. Conference of Mayors. Available for $15.00 from the U.S. Conference of Mayors, 1620 Eye St., NW, 4th Floor, Washington, DC, 20006-4005, 202/293-7330

9. “Criminal Offender Statistics, Bureau of Justice Statistics,” U.S. Department of Justice, (last visited 04/15/2004).