Beyond Epistemology: A Pragmatist Approach to Feminist Science Studies

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Sharyn Clough, Beyond Epistemology: A Pragmatist Approach to Feminist Science Studies, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 2003, 176 pp, $ 24.95 (pbk), ISBN 074251465X.

Reviewed by Alessandra Tanesini, Cardiff University


In this book Sharyn Clough argues that feminists who write about science should abandon epistemology and, instead, re-direct their attention to local questions concerning specific scientific theories. In her opinion, the focus on epistemology, characteristic of feminist studies of science in the 1990's, has been counterproductive for a variety of reasons. Firstly, Clough argues that epistemology presupposes a representationalist model of the relation between mind and world. This model, she claims, is of a piece with worries about scepticism. She also believes that these same worries generate a false dilemma between objectivism and relativism. Further, Clough notes that much feminist work on science in the 1990's has been concerned with finding a middle way between these two extremes. Thus, since she believes this to be a false dilemma, Clough is convinced that much energy has been wasted in this way.

Secondly, Clough claims that feminists should concern themselves directly with rebutting those scientific theories which actually harm people. The focus on epistemology, she notes, has directed people away from this more pressing task.

Thirdly, Clough argues that many feminist epistemological accounts of science suffer from the twin defects of over-generalisation and excessive abstraction. Clough is aware that these defects are not a necessary feature of all epistemological accounts. But she argues that the writings of Evelyn Fox Keller, Ruth Bleier, Ruth Hubbard and Sandra Harding often present both these defects. In particular, Clough claims that all these feminist writers assert false universal statements involving gender categories. They are led to such mistakes by a failure to pay sufficient attention to issues of race and class. Clough also argues that the same theorists have a tendency to produce critiques of science that treat the whole of science as a uniform monolith.

Surprisingly, in my opinion, in the last third of the book Clough does not proceed by practising what she preaches. Instead, she mostly offers a discussion of Davidson's views on radical interpretation as an alternative framework for feminists to adopt. It is only in the very last chapter that Clough discusses specific scientific theories in evolutionary biology.

There is much that is valuable in this book. In particular, Clough's claim that some feminist accounts of science are guilty of over-generalisation is, in my opinion, absolutely correct. Clough takes issue with those feminists like Keller who use psychoanalysis to argue that the whole of science has been developed in accordance with a masculine mode of thinking. Clough rightly points out that there is not much evidence in favour of such a generalisation, especially given the less than secure status of psychoanalysis itself as a scientific discipline. In general, I think that Clough is right to suggest that science is not a monolith, and that while some scientific theories might exhibit an androcentric bias, others might not.

Clough's claim that feminist philosophers of science should not ignore issues local to specific scientific theories is, therefore, well-taken. But I believe she oversteps the mark, because she suggests that feminists should stop asking all general questions, and restrict themselves to offering criticisms internal to specific science projects. Her motives for restricting inquiry to local questions are varied. First, she claims that scientists do not take seriously feminist critiques of specific theories because they are put off by the general claims which they either find irrelevant or plainly false. I find this to be an odd sort of complaint; very few scientists have any interest in either the philosophy of science or in science studies in general. I do not see this as a sufficient reason for abandoning these areas of study.

Second, she implicitly suggests that attention to specific scientific projects shows that the idea of a distinctly unique scientific method is a myth. Hence, the philosophical project of elucidating the scientific method must be abandoned. And it might be. It does not follow, however, that there are no general questions about science which feminists might want to ask.

Third, Clough provides philosophical arguments for the claim that the whole of epistemology rests on false assumptions and must therefore be abandoned. There is always a danger that any disagreement as to whether epistemology should be reformed or abandoned quickly degenerates into a verbal dispute. Thus, I am not going to frame my objections to Clough's arguments as a defence of epistemology. Instead, I argue that the need to find a third way between objectivism and relativism survives the demise of the representationalist framework.

Clough bases her rejection of epistemology on the idea that it presupposes a false representationalist position. Her account of representationalism is, I take it, the same as Rorty's. The representationalist model sets the mind as the locus of representations apart from the world as the locus of what is represented. Mind and world, thus conceived, must be related in order for the representations to represent at all, either truly or falsely. Further, the distinction between true and false, justified and unjustified representations also needs to be accounted for within this model. There appear to be only two alternative accounts: foundationalism and coherentism. The first typically takes justification to be a mind-world relation, the second takes it to be a mind-mind relation. Either account can be conceived as an attempt to address global sceptical questions.

I agree with Clough that foundationalism and coherentism are the two prongs of a false dilemma generated by the representationalist model, but I do not see how abandoning this model makes all problems about the justification of our beliefs disappear. In particular, the problem of how to avoid relativism without resorting to objectivism remains. Clough relies on Davidson to argue that relativism is not a serious threat. Even assuming that Davidson's arguments against conceptual relativism are correct, I do not see how they dispel the kind of relativism we are concerned with here. Supposing that no sense can be made of disagreement between individuals or cultures unless there is a vast bedrock of agreement between them, not all kinds of relativism are thereby dispelled. The tribal chief who rationally (but falsely) believes that the world came into being at the moment of his birth could still agree on a vast number of issues with the Western traveler, but it might still be impossible by rational means to bring him to see that the world existed before his birth. If cases such as this one are possible, some forms of relativism might be correct. Davidson's principle of charity is of no help here.

Other general 'epistemological' questions also survive the demise of the representationalist model. One such question concerns the roles played by political values in the justification of scientific theories. Clough must be aware that such problems remain because she tries to address them herself. Her answer is that political values are just beliefs with empirical content that can be used to confirm or disconfirm other beliefs, and that are themselves subject to empirical confirmation or disconfirmation. I find these claims to be rather perplexing. Even if we suppose that there is no dichotomy of facts and values, I do not see how values can be empirically confirmed. I do not wish to deny that empirical facts can be relevant to moral and political discussions, but I hold that to think that these facts can settle such discussions is to get the shape of moral and political arguments badly wrong.

Clough also appears to be committed to the view that feminist values always constitute evidence in favour of any scientific theory which is based on them. I find this commitment surprising, since it is precisely the sort of general claim about scientific evidence which could figure in the sort of epistemological accounts of science that Clough is keen to rule out of court. Be that as it may, the view, I believe, is false. Values, including feminist values, play many different roles in science: they can influence the selection of the relevant evidence, they might lead to the formulation of new hypotheses, they might guide judgements about the initial plausibility of a given theory. It is unhelpful to reduce this variety to general claims about evidential relations. These criticisms asides, I think that Clough's most important recommendation in this book is one that needs to be heeded. The best feminist philosophy of science is done by starting from case studies.