Beyond Hegel And Nietzsche: Philosophy, Culture and Agency

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Jurist, Elliot L., Beyond Hegel And Nietzsche: Philosophy, Culture and Agency, MIT Press, 2002, 335pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 0-262-60048-X.

Reviewed by Matthew Ray, University of Warwick


Elliot L. Jurist’s Beyond Hegel And Nietzsche is a text concerned, not to diminish the importance of these two influential and major thinkers from the history of modern philosophy, as a casual glance at Jurist’s title might at first suggest, but rather to amplify it. It aims to achieve such an amplification by arguing against what is now – particularly since the French philosopher Gilles Deleuze’s controversially polemical Nietzsche and Philosophy – virtually a commonplace amongst authors writing on German philosophy in the post-Kantian period: that Hegel and Nietzsche are “philosophical opposites” (p.1). More specifically, Jurist attempts to demonstrate that Hegel’s and Nietzsche’s thinking is commensurable and even complementary with regard to certain specific themes, not least the topics of culture and agency. This is a controversial interpretation. Nevertheless, Jurist makes a relatively plausible case for our consideration of it as a viable reading, as I shall be maintaining. Yet it is worth mentioning here that the book also covers a lot of other ground en passant and, in this connection, many good points are made about much more recent thinkers influenced by either Hegel or Nietzsche, such as Theodor Adorno, Max Horkheimer and Jacques Derrida. Moreover, this is probably also the right place to mention that the excursus on the resemblances between Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit – a key text in Jurist’s Hegel exegesis – and the structure of ancient Greek tragedy is a particularly surprising and revealing textual deviation (pp. 87-94).

But let us get down to the business of expounding Beyond Hegel And Nietzsche’s principal line of philosophical argument. Both Hegel and Nietzsche, Jurist claims, eschew the manner and method of the famous “armchair odyssey” (p. 18) of Descartes’ Meditations in favor of seeing philosophy as integrally bound up with human culture. This is, I think, a good point and one that is well made (Nietzsche’s early works, as is well known, are principally concerned with culture and Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit is a text which integrates epistemological and socio-political issues in a manner that appears to be absent from the Cartesian enterprise of reconnecting subjectivity and alterity). But Jurist, happily, does not overplay the comparison between Hegel and Nietzsche on the topic of the self-understanding of philosophy itself, and in this regard he goes on to make the important point that in Nietzsche’s case (but not of course in Hegel’s) “tragedy, which has its source in music, conveys deeper truths than philosophy, which restricts communication to words” (p. 81). However, it seems to me important to point out here that this Nietzschean point is not simply anti-Hegelian but is also actively neo-Schopenhauerian. Consequently one is tempted to wonder at this point whether in so placing such a detail of the Nietzschean argument in its proper Schopenhauerian context –which Jurist does not do, though he does mention Schopenhauer’s influence on Nietzsche’s Birth of Tragedy from the Spirit of Music on p. 84 – one thereby eliminates the possibility of seeing it as only a minor skirmish with Hegel rather than as a symptomatic clash based upon profoundly different sets of metaphysical and epistemological commitments, albeit sets of metaphysical and epistemological commitments both ultimately derived from meditations upon the supposed limitations of the Kantian critical enterprise. Relatedly, Jurist’s later discussion of Nietzsche’s concept of the will (pp. 232-235) would, in my opinion, have benefited from a prior elaboration of Schopenhauer’s own notion of the will, which forms the obvious theoretical background to Nietzsche’s thoughts on the matter. Peter Poellner, for one, has in recent years linked Nietzsche’s arguments for the will to Schopenhauer’s, in a manner that seems to me to be fairly convincing (see his Nietzsche and Metaphysics (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995), especially p. 268). And more generally, it is, perhaps, quite telling that those commentators such as Jurist who are keen to bring Hegel and Nietzsche closer to one another are also often relatively neglectful of Schopenhauer’s influence upon the latter; whilst those authors – for example, Poellner and Deleuze – who attempt to take account of and explicate Schopenhauer’s importance for Nietzsche, seem (consequently?) to be less concerned to draw Nietzschean parallels with Hegel. (As a notable exception I should at least mention S. Houlgate’s Hegel, Nietzsche and the Criticism of Metaphysics [Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1986], which brings Hegel and Nietzsche together without neglecting a scholarly appreciation of the important role of Schopenhauer in the intellectual development of Nietzsche). Of course, the very presence of Schopenhauerian roots in Nietzsche does not immediately invalidate a reconciliation of Hegel and Nietzsche – but it does constitute prima facie evidence against one and, with this in mind, the claim of these roots might have been given due notice by Jurist. Yet the principal point that both Hegel and Nietzsche see philosophy as always being in relation to culture, which is a theme running throughout Jurist’s book, seems to me to be substantially and importantly correct, as does the closely related claim that it is above all this which separates Hegel’s and Nietzsche’s thought from the classical rationalism represented by Descartes.

More problematic, it might well be thought, is Jurist’s attempt to dovetail the thought of Hegel and Nietzsche on the particular topic of agency – for there is an at least superficial case for stating that Nietzsche seems to deny the very reality of human agency. However, it is very well known that Nietzsche’s thought has many conflicting strands in it and, given this notorious degree of ambiguity, I would maintain that Jurist’s attempt to work out a Nietzschean model of human agency (and then to connect it with Hegel’s) is a perfectly legitimate enterprise, just so long as one bears in mind that the position Jurist attributes to Nietzsche is not all that Nietzsche has to say on the matter, though it may well be, at best, the most consistent reconstruction or even, perhaps, simply a stimulating and supportable one.

Now, Hegel’s notion of agency is, as one would expect, elaborated with continual attention to the master/slave dialectic as found in the Phenomenology of Spirit. As this point may also be put, it takes account of the importance to Hegel of recognition by others. Others help us know ourselves and are thus necessary for self-knowledge and agency in Hegel (p. 245). Agency, for Hegel, is in this precise sense thus a product of intersubjectivty. This is an uncontentious reading of Hegel, but it is not obviously the case for Nietzsche, as is well known, and in this connection Jurist makes the point that “Nietzsche never squarely faces whether there might be something desirable about incorporating the views of others and thereby transcending the personal” (p. 39). But this does not seem to be right as an interpretation of Nietzsche. Nietzsche does face that precise question but answers it negatively: the third essay of On the Genealogy of Morals, amongst other texts, makes it quite clear that our goal as a species is not knowledge (“the ascetic ideal”) nor even that value which utilitarians such as J.S. Mill took to be so uncontestable: happiness. (Both of these goals might well require for their attainment incorporating the views of others.) Nietzsche thinks rather that our goal is a valuable or noble life; and such a life is to be achieved, or recognized by emotive self-sufficiency or self-reliance rather than the—in Nietzschean terms—”weak” or “slavish” need for external stimuli. As the first essay of that collection typically puts it: “The noble method of evaluation: this acts and grows spontaneously” [On the Genealogy of Morals, Essay I, Section 10]. Jurist however, is concerned to argue that there is nonetheless a need for recognizing others in Nietzsche (p. 247), but the initial and main quotes Jurist cites for this highly controversial view are from books such as Human,All Too Human and the Gay Science – texts not generally regarded to be from Nietzsche’s mature period. That said, however, Jurist’s subsequent discussion of the importance of the notion of friendship to Nietzsche’s model of the human agent is much better judged and seems much more persuasive, although I suspect that doubts may remain in some readers about the degree to which this reflects the spirit of the Nietzschean text. Nevertheless, it remains a supportable reading.

Ultimately, we might say that what emerges from Jurist’s Beyond Hegel And Nietzsche is a fairly recognizable Hegel but a much less familiar Nietzsche, a Nietzsche who ties philosophy to culture in line with Hegel and Marx but who also, much less familiarly, elaborates a theory of agency connected with our relationship to others. Such a manner of interpreting and reconstructing a model of agency connected with an “other” is, of course, a highly Hegelian enterprise, but it is to Elliot L. Jurist’s credit that in this scholarly and lucidly written work, which is clearly argued throughout, he makes a persuasive case for it seeming a little Nietzschean, too.