Beyond "Justification": Dimensions of Epistemic Evaluation

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William P. Alston, Beyond "Justification": Dimensions of Epistemic Evaluation, Cornell University Press, 2005, 276pp, $45.00 (hbk) ISBN 0801442915.

Reviewed by Richard Feldman, University of Rochester


In Beyond "Justification" William Alston defends a pluralist account of epistemic evaluation. In recent years epistemologists have been preoccupied with what he regards as a fruitless quest for a theory of epistemic justification. Reliabilists, proper functionalists, evidentialists, and others argue for their preferred theory of justification. Alston urges epistemologists to give this up. He thinks that there is no such thing as justification, but there are instead a variety of factors, or epistemic desiderata, that properly enter into epistemic evaluations. The book is an effort to describe the most important of these desiderata, unburdened by worries about which is central to "justification." The book begins with Alston's arguments for dispensing with "justification." There follow two chapters setting out the general features of his epistemic desiderata approach. The core of the book is a set of chapters discussing in detail the various desiderata. These include most of the concepts familiar to contemporary epistemologists -- reliability, adequate grounds, the basing relation -- and so on. These chapters are of interest in their own right, independent of their contribution to the general thesis. The final chapters examine the impact of the epistemic desiderata approach for some ultimate questions in epistemology, including epistemic circularity and skepticism.

Alston argues in Chapter 1 that "the widespread supposition that 'justified' picks out an objective feature of belief that is of central epistemic importance is a thoroughly misguided one."(11) His defense of this begins with a presentation of numerous passages in which philosophers present widely different views about justification. Some characterize justification in deontological terms (i.e., what one ought to believe or is permitted to believe), others use good evidence, reliability, proper function, or other concepts. Even those characterizations in the same general vicinity display notable differences. For example, some evidentialists emphasize having good reasons, while others add that the belief must be based on good evidence. The deontologists differ over whether the central condition is one of permission or requirement. One possible explanation of this "chaotic picture" is that theorizing about justification is a hard problem about which smart people can differ. Alston's preferred explanation is that there is no "objective property of beliefs picked out by 'justified'."(21) He offers two reasons for his preferred alternative: there is no theoretically neutral way to say what justification is that would enable us to resolve the dispute concerning the competing theoretical accounts (23-25), and there is not a robust set of paradigm cases of justified belief to yield data to resolve the disputes since proponents of the various theories differ about the cases as well (25-26). This is a provocative argument, deserving of careful thought by anyone interested in justification. One wonders whether comparable arguments apply to other controversial philosophical disputes.

In Chapters 2 and 3 Alston identifies the epistemic point of view and the various epistemic desiderata. His starting point is that "the acquisition, retention, and use of true beliefs about matters that are of interest and/or importance is the most basic and most central goal of cognition."(30) Only properties that promote this goal can be epistemic desiderata (93). Alston says that "short of the basic desideratum of truth itself, no status of a belief can be more favorable vis-a-vis the goal of truth than a status that renders the belief at least likely to be true."(36) I find this a bit puzzling. If the goal is true belief, then a false belief fails to meet the goal. A belief that is likely to be true is only likely to have a favorable status in terms of that goal. Alston seems to assume, as many do, that being likely to have value is itself valuable. In any case, Alston goes on to identify the central epistemic desiderata. The most crucial of these are the directly truth-conducive desiderata: having adequate evidence, being based on adequate evidence, being formed by a reliable process, being formed by proper functioning, and being formed by intellectual virtues. Other potential desiderata concern higher-level properties of beliefs, such as having evidence that one has adequate evidence or being able to carry out a defense of a belief. He also considers deontological features, such as being held permissibly or responsibly, and, finally, features of whole systems of belief such as coherence and systematicity. The next several chapters address the nature, viability, importance, and interrelations of these desiderata.

Chapter 4 takes up deontological desiderata. Readers familiar with Alston's earlier work on doxastic voluntarism will recognize the general themes of this chapter. Alston distinguishes a variety of concepts of control. He claims that we lack the more robust kinds of control. We do have indirect influence over some beliefs and we can affect some behavior that affects our beliefs. But the deontological desiderata all fail to be proper epistemic desiderata, either because they would apply only if we had stronger forms of control or because they are not sufficiently connected to truth.

Chapters 5 and 6, on adequacy of grounds and reliability, are the longest chapters in the book, and many readers will find them the most stimulating. I cannot in this short review do justice to Alston's rich and detailed treatment of these topics. The two desiderata concerning adequate evidence are (1) merely having adequate grounds for a belief and (2) basing one's belief on those grounds. Alston argues that (2) is a more valuable epistemic property than (1). He says that (2) is the "actualization" of (1) and that the mere "possibility of something desirable is less desirable than its realization."(90) I find his claim unconvincing. I do not see why the likelihood that your belief is true is greater if you base it on supporting evidence than if you have that supporting evidence but base it on something else. If (2) is a more important epistemic desideratum than (1), it must be because there is some epistemic value other than truth. Things such as justification or knowledge suggest themselves, but they do not fit into Alston's account.

Alston holds that something is grounds for a belief only if it makes it probable that the belief is true (94). He settles on a propensity account of the relevant notion of probability. Thus, his view, applied to visual perception, is that a visual appearance is grounds for a belief provided it has a propensity to make the belief true, and that it "has a propensity to yield true beliefs about what is presenting the appearance iff it is generally the case that visual appearances like that would give rise to true beliefs about what is appearing in a sufficiently large and varied number of cases of such appearances generating beliefs about what is appearing."(110)

Alston devotes Chapter 6 to reliabilism. The discussion is centered on providing a response to the generality problem, which I will only describe briefly. The reliabilist desideratum says that a belief has a valuable epistemic property provided it results from a reliable belief-forming process. The process leading to a typical belief, say my belief that I see a desk, can be categorized in many ways: perception, visual perception, visual perception involving a perceptual experience with particular qualities and leading to the belief that I see a desk. We have a grasp of the reliability condition only when we have a grasp of which of these process types it is about. The generality problem asks reliabilists to identify the relevant process types. Alston emphasizes two features of the relevant process types. One is that they are, or are represented by, functions.(126) Therefore, for any input to a process type, there is only one belief that it can produce. Second, he emphasizes a commitment to psychological realism.(139) Alston says that this entails that the input to a belief-forming process is determined by those aspects of the perceptual experience that actually play a role in bringing about the resultant belief. He writes, "I assume that just one way of generalizing from this particular input-belief output relationship reflects the actual psychological dynamics of the process."(139) Alston also relies on a third crucial point. Some passages suggest that he thinks that this third point follows from the other two. The third point is that types are individuated very narrowly -- if different features of an experience produce beliefs (either the same or different in content), then the processes of are of different types. Thus, if on one occasion a visual experience leads you to believe that you see an oak tree and on a different occasion a different experience leads you to believe that you see a maple tree, different processes are operative. This third point does not follow from the others. A more general tree-identification process could be psychologically real, could correspond to a function, and could take as inputs only collections of causally relevant properties. Nevertheless, this narrow scheme of individuation is an account of processes that merits attention. My colleague Earl Conee and I have previously raised objections to this view.[1] I will not repeat them here.

Narrow individuation of types combined with a reliabilist account of reasons supports Alston's claim that the reliability desideratum and the based-on-adequate-grounds desideratum are equivalent. (See Ch. 6, Section v for his most thorough treatment of this.) This is a striking result. It has a notable implication for Alston's claims about the advantages of getting beyond "justification." Alston thinks his non-justificationist stance puts him above the fray with respect to examples such as BonJour's clairvoyant who reliably forms beliefs he (seemingly) has no good reason to accept and victims of evil demons who have plenty of good reasons to believe things even though their processes are (apparently) thoroughly unreliable.(54-57) But, if Alston's equivalence thesis is correct, then, contrary to his suggestion, the disagreement about these examples is not that those who react to them differently are simply emphasizing different desiderata, grounds or reliability. On his view, these desiderata, properly interpreted, have the same implications.

Epistemic virtues receive brief treatment toward the end of Chapter 6. Chapters 7 and 8 cover some epistemic desiderata that Alston regards as less central. These include higher-order properties, such as knowing that one has adequate evidence, and properties of systems of beliefs such as coherence and explanatory power. There is also a discussion of situations in which the various desiderata are of greater or lesser importance.

Chapters 9-11 constitute part II of the book. The material on epistemic circularity in these chapters will be familiar to readers who have studied Alston's influential earlier treatment of this material, although he does modify his view here. He holds that epistemic circularity arises in trying to show that certain general methods of forming beliefs -- doxastic practices -- are reliable. Thus, we might try to show that perception is generally reliable by appeal to "track-record arguments" -- arguments whose premises assert the accuracy of some individual perceptual beliefs and whose conclusion asserts the general reliability of the practice. Alston acknowledges that he cannot prove that every argument for such a conclusion is epistemically circular (or otherwise defective) but believes that this is the case (p. 207). He says that we can avoid circularity by addressing our doxastic practices piecemeal, but this will not get us the big-picture conclusion philosophers seek.

I must admit that I find the concept of epistemic circularity obscure. Alston admits that the premises of a track-record argument for the reliability of perception can be adequately grounded, as he must given his view that a premise is adequately grounded if it is based on grounds that make it likely to be true. And he agrees that generalizing from the cases can be epistemically acceptable as well. Thus, he says that, even though the argument is epistemically circular, this "does not of itself prevent the argument from being used to establish its conclusion."(203) The epistemic circularity apparently follows from the fact that the premises of the argument will be reliably formed only if the conclusion is true. Thus, he says, the argument will not help anyone who is unsure about the matter "find out" if the conclusion is true.(203) If, on his view, the track-record argument "establishes" its conclusion that perception is reliable, then it is unclear to me what is supposed to wrong with it. He says that we could just as well show that crystal ball gazing is reliable.(204) But this is false, since the premises of that argument would not be adequately grounded, on Alston's account. Alston must have in mind some other epistemic status for the argument, but I remain unclear what it is. Of course, those who interpret "adequate grounds" differently may have different responses to these arguments.

In Ch. 10 Alston distinguishes Cartesian, Humean, and Pyrrhonian skepticism. He now rejects the "practical rationality" response to the latter. His earlier position conceded that we could not show that our doxastic practices are reliable without falling into epistemic circularity, but argued that our use of those practices was nevertheless practically rational. He now concedes that this is "defective" and "cumbersome".(221) He instead responds that we have "no alternative to using in an investigation [of our belief-forming practices] what we accept at that point as reliable belief-forming practices and probably true beliefs."(221) As he also puts it, "So long as we are alive we cannot help having beliefs, nor can we avoid using them to guide our thought and action."(218) He appeals to Reid for support, arguing that those approaches that take for granted the reliability of some doxastic practices, such as introspection and reasoning, but raise questions about others, such as perception, are arbitrarily selecting what to accept and what to call into question.

Ch. 11 includes a discussion of foundationalism, coherentism, and contextualism. These are offered as theories about "the overall epistemic organization of beliefs."(230) In a short section Alston nicely displays various options open to foundationalists and to coherentists. His account of contextualism struck me as idiosyncratic. He describes it as a "poor man's coherentism" in which every inquiry "takes place in a context that is itself taken for granted."(238) As far as I can tell, this is not closely connected to the collection of views going under the "contextualist" banner in recent years. Alston argues that the epistemic-desiderata approach does not significantly alter the debate about the epistemic organization of beliefs. He thinks coherentism suffers from a version of the multiple-alternative-systems objection and that contextualism, at least as he is thinking of it, "is not really a competitor" as an account of this matter. He admits that his own approach to the epistemic circularity problem is, in effect, a kind of contextualism applied to a specific epistemological topic.

Beyond "Justification" is an engaging, provocative, and carefully argued book. It displays all the virtues of clarity and rigor that epistemologists have long admired in Alston's work. It is an important contribution.

[1]. See "The Generality Problem for Reliabilism," Philosophical Studies 89, pp. 1-29. See especially Section III, Part C. The paper is reprinted in Earl Conee and Richard Feldman, Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004).