Beyond Reduction: Philosophy of Mind and Post-Reductionist Philosophy of Science

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Steven Horst, Beyond Reduction: Philosophy of Mind and Post-Reductionist Philosophy of Science, Oxford University Press, 2007, 223pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195317114.

Reviewed by D. Gene Witmer, University of Florida


The starting point of Beyond Reduction is an apparently simple observation:  much debate over the "mind-body problem" presupposes that the mental is unique in being resistant to reduction, yet there is a consensus in contemporary philosophy of science that reductionism is in general untenable.  It's not that chemistry, biology, and the rest all clearly reduce to physics while the mental, due to some special explanatory gap, stands curiously apart.  Rather, Horst maintains, "in the sciences it is explanatory gaps all the way down" (4).  If this is correct, then contemporary debates about physicalism and the status of the mental need rethinking.  Horst's overall project in this book is to do just such rethinking.  The result is "Cognitive Pluralism," a general theory about the character of our cognitive engagement with the world and the resulting objects of knowledge.  Briefly, Cognitive Pluralism implies that the disunity of our picture of the world is an unsurprising result of the disunified character of our cognitive tools:  we have various means of developing models of the world, where those models are likely to be limited in ways that prevent their integration into a larger picture of the whole.

Regardless of the ultimate verdict on these positive claims, Beyond Reduction is an important contribution to the contemporary discussion.  One might even say it is a necessary book.  The observation that serves as its starting point is one that has been made before, but to my knowledge this is the first time it has been subjected to such a sustained and vigorous examination.

The book is divided into three parts.  The first sets the stage, distinguishing varieties of "naturalism" and "reductionism," providing an overview of contemporary debates on the mind-body problem, and detailing the anti-reductionist consensus of empirically informed philosophy of science.  The second and third parts are devoted to the lessons we should draw from that consensus, the second focusing on lessons for the mind-body problem in particular and the third taking a broader view and developing Cognitive Pluralism as a general theory.  While not terribly long, Beyond Reduction thus covers a great deal of ground, not all of which can be touched on here.

Horst offers at the outset the following schematic characterization of "naturalism":

Naturalism about domain D is the view that all features of D are to be accommodated within the framework of nature as it is understood by the natural sciences.  (13)

As he notes, this formulation leaves much open by way of clarifying just what "accommodation" is supposed to be or just what one presumes about "the framework of nature as it is understood by the natural sciences."  All such varieties need, however, to be carefully distinguished from another kind of "naturalism" that Horst clearly endorses, namely, that according to which "epistemology should not be pursued as an armchair, aprioristic enterprise, but should be informed by, and indeed be continuous with, the scientific study of the mind" (20).  In effect, Horst's view is that faithful adherence to this latter methodological dictum should lead us to see that the more substantive naturalism delineated by the above formula is implausible.

Another crucial distinction is in order, however, namely between a version of substantive naturalism that is itself normative and a version that is not.  Horst writes:

[S]ometimes naturalistic claims are put forward as a kind of positive claim -- a claim about how things are.  These are a sort of second-order empirical claim about how it will turn out in the long run… .  But some naturalists have an uneasy tendency to slide into a different sort of claim that is not empirical or positive, but normative.  They claim, in essence, that the mind must be naturalized, or else something unseemly follows:  that psychology cannot be scientific unless its objects can be explained in terms of something more fundamental, or that mental states do not exist unless they supervene upon physical states.  (15)

Throughout the book, Horst makes much of this second alleged kind of naturalism.  He blames it in part on the logical positivists (24), pointing to the fact that they imposed a priori some constraints on how science ought to proceed.  However, I find it very hard to believe that anyone ever thought it a priori that any legitimate science reduces to physics.  The positivists may have insisted that scientific terms be definable or otherwise analytically linked to "physical" terms, but this is hardly to say anything about the derivability of theories.  Carnap was, after all, careful to distinguish a unity of terms from a unity of laws.  Further, the notion of "physical" at issue with the positivists was not a notion tied to the discipline of physics so much as just the idea of a term that denotes some intersubjectively verifiable phenomenon.  In any case, what Horst picks up on here as a normative claim about reducibility is more charitably and sensibly understood as a conditional kind of normativity.  If one is already convinced -- by means of some empirical evidence -- that reductive physicalism is true, then it is perfectly sensible to argue that if a given alleged phenomenon is not thus reducible, then we ought not to believe it exists, or, presumably, allow sciences to develop on the presumption that it does.  It is, I submit, most plausible to interpret much of contemporary philosophy of mind as presuming that science has given us this kind of empirical evidence -- that it has shown us that in many cases reductions are to be had, or, at least, that there is enough information to give us warrant for thinking reductions are available in principle.  Of course, Horst thinks there is no such evidence, so let us turn to that crucial issue.

It may be quite right that there is a consensus in philosophy of science that reductions are rarely to be found, or that, as Horst puts it emphatically in the introduction, "[b]iology is not reducible to chemistry and physics in the fashion conceived by such twentieth-century luminaries as Rudolf Carnap and Ernest Nagel," and "in the relevant sense of 'reduction', chemistry is not reducible to physics, and thermodynamics is not reducible to statistical mechanics" (4).  But caution is in order here.  The term "reductionism" is nearly as bad as "naturalism" in terms of being unclear and contested in its meaning.  It may well be that the antireductionist consensus depends on a more restrictive notion of reduction than that had in mind by would-be reductionists in philosophy of mind.  So just what is the sense of "reduction" at issue here?

Horst certainly has in mind an intertheoretic notion of reduction; he also makes it plain that he is not requiring of a reduction that it include type identities between different levels (see the discussion of functionalism on pp. 25-6).  He does not, however, try to make the notion precise until p. 31 in Chapter 2, where he writes:

We have thus far characterized "broad reductionism" only very informally, saying that it is broader and weaker than the type-identity thesis, and that its core commitment is to bottom-up explanations.  A bit more formally, the characteristic features of broadly reductive explanations are that they are:

1.  Part-whole explanations (i.e., explanations of features of an entire system in terms of the properties and relations of its proper parts, or of elements lying at an ontological level no more complex than that of its proper parts), and

2.  Explanations without remainder, or alternatively, conceptually adequate explanations.

Both of these conditions deserve further comment.  With regards to the first, Horst immediately clarifies the condition as not meaning that the facts that do the explaining must be confined to facts about the parts of the system whose features are being explained; rather, it means only that the explanatory facts must be at a "lower level" than the facts to be explained.  It is, I think, easy enough to make the idea here more precise.  If we want to say that facts of kind A reduce to facts of kind B, then for every explanation of an A-fact, the explanatory facts are themselves neither A-facts nor facts which, themselves, are plainly to be explained in terms of further A-facts.

With regards to the second, the idea seems to be that the explanatory facts are on their own entirely sufficient for the explained fact, although Horst never puts it quite that way.  He writes:

Philosophers have traditionally been interested in a notion of reduction that is closely connected with metaphysical necessity, and with good reason:  if you have a part-whole explanation without remainder of A in terms of B, you have thereby guaranteed that B → A is metaphysically necessary as well… .  Since connections with metaphysics and unification have historically been important parts of the reductionist project in philosophy of science and philosophy of mind, I shall here reserve the word 'reduction' for a usage that implies not only part-whole explanation, but part-whole explanations that are also comprehensive, in the sense of explaining everything about the reduced system.  (33; emphasis original)

I find myself puzzled by the last remark.  Suppose "A" and "B" are propositions where "A" is the proposition that a given system S has feature F; in that case, of course the necessity of "B → A" (the material conditional, I presume) doesn't imply that everything about S is explained.  On the other hand, if "A" is understood as a proposition that is comprehensive in that it details everything about S, then getting a comprehensive explanation in this last sense has nothing to do with the modal strength of "B → A".  My sense, however, is that this last remark is just a mistake, and that what Horst really has in mind by "explanation without remainder" or "conceptually adequate explanation" is an explanation that includes within itself sufficient resources to do the explaining, so that nothing else is required to complete the explanation of that very thing, not that there is no more to be explained.  This seems borne out by his brief further remarks on "conceptually adequate explanations," where he says that an explanation of A in terms of B is thus adequate "just in case the conceptual content of B is sufficiently rich to generate that of A without the addition of anything fundamentally new" (33, quoting from his 1996 book).  In other words, one need not add anything "fundamentally new" to B to determine A, and that indeed seems to me the right way to think about the philosophically relevant notion of reduction.

Given what Horst tells us about "reduction" in the operative sense, it seems unlikely that it is so narrow as to be beside the point in contemporary debates about the mind.  I must confess, however, that I found the crucial third chapter of the book -- "The Demise of Reductionism in Philosophy of Science" -- to be very frustrating.  Horst doesn't pretend to be himself making the case against reductionism in this chapter, instead explicitly presenting it as a summary of results developed by others.  Still, it's crucial, if we're to understand the significance of these results, that it be clear just how they relate to the operative notion of reduction earlier given.  I found myself puzzling over this relation while working through this chapter.

Let me illustrate.  After some introductory discussion, Horst begins the discussion with a subsection entitled "Rejecting the Derivational Model of Explanation."  He writes:

One of the core features of all versions of the historically influential forms of reductionism is that they treat explanation as some sort of derivation, be it on the model of syllogism, mathematical proof, axiomatic systems, or construction.  The Positivist/Logical Empiricist project might indeed be viewed in part as a grand attempt to reconstruct scientific explanations in axiomatic form.  The only problem is that the attempt failed.  It was most successful in the reconstruction of mechanics… .  But the concentration on mechanics tended to obscure the fact that mechanics was, if anything, a special case in its susceptibility to axiomatic reconstruction.  (49)

The problem here seems to be that we can't provide a certain kind of representation of the contents of a theory, viz. an axiomatization.  If one can't provide any finite, formal representation of what a theory says, it is of course impossible to derive anything from it in any exacting sense.  But exactly what does this show?  Recall that the core notion of reduction here is one concerning explanation, not derivation.  Say theory A was thought to reduce to B, but A cannot be derived from B because we don't have available the formal representations of A and/or B.  Does this show that A does not reduce to B?  It does if we assume that derivation is needed for explanation.  But this section announces the rejection of that claim -- so shouldn't it still be open to us to say that A is reductively explained by B even though a derivation is impossible?

I suspect that what Horst may say here is that in such a situation, where no formal derivation is available even in principle, we should not have any confidence that the explanation in question is, to use the terms he introduced earlier, a conceptually adequate explanation.  After all, without such formalization, one may wonder why we should think that the B-facts are really doing all the work on their own in explaining the A-facts.  This may be an important point, but it's not one that shows up in the text, and in general my impression is that much more could have been done with these results from the philosophy of science if care had been taken to make the relevance of these results more explicit.

Now I should hasten to add it is easy to see the relevance of much of what is discussed in this chapter to one kind of reductionist thesis -- namely, the normative thesis that it is a priori that any legitimate science must be reducible to physics.  The normative thesis is clearly the target in sections 3.2.4 ("The Plurality of Explanatory Types"), 3.2.5 ("Autonomy of Local Domains") and 3.2.6 ("Plurality of 'Good-making' Qualities").  Horst himself emphasizes the normative thesis at several points; as he puts it in a later chapter:

It is widely accepted that the special sciences are "autonomous," both in the sense that local explanatory successes are self-justifying and are not held hostage to reductive integration with more basic levels of explanation, and in the sense that they employ diverse methodologies and forms of explanation and postulate different types of entities.  (71)

This is all well and good, but it's not directly relevant to the claim that science in fact has uncovered many reductions or (again) enough information to warrant the claim that they are very often available in principle.  I've already indicated that I doubt the normative thesis (understood not as a consequence of an empirically supported non-normative claim about reductive success) is a straw man.  It is frustrating, then, that so much of what Horst focuses on is autonomy in the sense defined above, which autonomy seems beside the point.

This is not to say, of course, that nothing in the crucial third chapter focuses on the relevant non-normative claim.  The key section is 3.2.2, "The Scarcity of True Reductions," which provides a (very) brief survey of reasons to think that reductions are in fact not often found in science.  One sort of problem that arises with attempts at derivation, as illustrated in the famous case of thermodynamics and statistical mechanics, is that the derivations that are achievable require the use of auxiliary assumptions that are quite problematic -- assumptions that are either just false or at any rate not part of the reducing theory (51).  This kind of problem seems to be most important not just for assessing the claim that actual reductions are rarely to be had but, further, for thinking about Horst's proposed Cognitive Pluralism.  That proposal is, after all, introduced partly as a way of explaining such difficulties in unifying domains; in a nutshell, the idea is that theories developed for ostensibly different domains depend on idealizations that make it very difficult to relate them to each other, so that attempts to relate them may require auxiliary assumptions of a problematic character.  A more focused discussion of this specific kind of problem for reduction would have been welcome.

In any case, let us suppose that in fact science provides no evidence of widespread reducibility and turn to the second part of the book in which Horst considers the significance of this result for the mind-body problem.  Obviously, the appeal of reductive physicalism is undermined; further, however, Horst argues that physicalism itself is rendered unmotivated, as he thinks that the primary justification for physicalism in the first place is to be found in the alleged history of successful reductions.  He distances himself from dualism, arguing that we obviously need more than two categories if there are many different gaps; but, further, he doubts that we should draw any metaphysical conclusions from these gaps -- a point that comes to the fore in the last section developing Cognitive Pluralism.

Horst is surely right that the alleged history of successful reductions has been, historically, one of the main reasons for the popularity of physicalism.  But it is not the only sort of reason that has been put forward in favor of the doctrine.  In particular, appeals to the causal completeness of physics have played a major role in recent years.  Horst recognizes this and devotes several pages to criticizing this approach (101-109).  The criticism here is quite interesting and worth a careful review.  Part of his complaint is apparently just that such evidence for physicalism is not itself adequate to rebut antiphysicalist arguments (102), but that is not to the point.  The appeal to causal completeness and interaction is just to establish that there is evidence for physicalism, not to counter all evidence against it.  The better part of his complaint, however, concerns the gap between idealized theories and real-world application.  Perhaps the key idea is best expressed when he writes:

[O]n the one hand, the models we actually employ, usually piecemeal, to describe or explain a physical phenomenon tend to underdetermine the real-world behavior.  And, on the other hand, the idea that resultant behavior is determined by "a summation of all the forces that are in play," which looks so attractive in the abstract, often proves unworkable or even unintelligible when one turns to the details of the models employed by the scientist or the engineer.  This forces us to reexamine what we mean by such claims as "All physical effects are fully determined by law by prior physical occurrences."  If this is a claim about the kinds of explanation that are actually used by scientists and engineers, then the claim is simply false.  Single models seldom if ever fully account for the complexity of real-world kinematics.  And the kinds of examples surveyed by [Nancy] Cartwright and [Mark] Wilson show that it is often impossible to perform a true summation of forces.  (104)

The impossibility of summation is supposed to be more than just a practical limitation on computation; it is supposed to be a principled difficulty in making sense of the integration of different models.  The worry here is important, and though I am far from being in a position to assess it thoroughly, I do want to note one concern.  Depending on just what is meant by "physics" and the "physical," the worry may seem not so pressing.  If by "physics" we are including a broad array of different theories related to what is intuitively physical, then of course there are different theories in play and integration is an issue.  If, however, we restrict "physical" to the events and laws delineated in a narrower fashion -- say, only those at issue in quantum mechanics -- then it is no longer so clear that there is a need for such integration.  Further, however, I suggest that even if there is some need for integration, even partially successful integration may be good evidence that there exist causal factors of certain sorts that suffice to explain effects of the relevant physical kind.  If there is such evidence, at least, for completeness, then that is all that is needed for present purposes.

I suspect Horst may be unlikely to countenance such evidence given his tendencies to skepticism displayed elsewhere in the discussion of completeness.  Consider, for instance, his remarks on the conservation of matter and energy:

This principle is well-verified for a wide range of cases in mechanics and thermodynamics… .  This, however, does not entail that it is truly universal in scope, nor that it may be safely imported to what may be very different situations, such as human action… .  I would not go so far as Nancy Cartwright, who occasionally claims that experiments in carefully controlled laboratory environments give us literally no reason to expect that things will behave in the same ways outside of those environments.  But it does seem right to be cautious about assumptions concerning scope on the basis of constrained laboratory experiments.  (107)

It's one thing to be cautious; it's quite another to act as though there's no evidence at all for the completeness of physics.

A related motivation for physicalism that Horst discusses is an appeal to simplicity.  He rightly notes how facile such appeals can be but "begrudgingly admit[s] that there are very limited contexts in which it is of use" (113).  Surprisingly, however, that admission includes a point relevant to reduction that seems very much at odds with his overall agenda.  For consider what he says about the use of simplicity regarding temperature and kinetic energy:

It does seem that at least some identity claims have some explanatory power… .  Why does the temperature of a gas increase with the increase of mean kinetic energy of the gas molecules?  Because temperature (in a gas) is mean kinetic energy.  But, again, this is a case in which the identification of notions from two scientific theories is underwritten by a derivation that is, or is at least very close to, a CAE [conceptually adequate explanation].  We do not simply identify temperature and mean kinetic energy on the grounds that doing so simplifies our ontology; we do so because we can derive a significant set of thermodynamic phenomena from statistical mechanics.  (112)

Right here, Horst is allowing that the kinds of derivations we in fact find in science can provide evidence for cross-theoretic identities -- even given the kinds of problems that exist for actual derivations.  If that's right, however, then the widespread presumption that science gives us evidence for a kind of reductionism may be vindicated after all.  If such "close enough" explanations can justify these identity claims, then the "scarcity of true reductions" earlier discussed may be no problem for the inductive argument in support of a general reductive thesis -- or, at least, a general "identities with lower level entities" thesis.

Let's turn to the last section of the book, where Horst provides an outline of Cognitive Pluralism.  While I have less to say about this part of the book, I want to stress that it is in my view the most interesting and useful contribution made here.  The position is only sketched here and many questions remain unanswered, but the position is both provocative and important.

One element of Cognitive Pluralism is an insistence that our ability to understand the world is limited by our cognitive architecture, and it is an empirical matter just what limits are imposed by that architecture.  By itself, this claim is hard to deny; matters become more controversial when we make claims about the nature of those limits.  The pluralism of Cognitive Pluralism in part concerns those limits.  As Horst puts it:

It is a pluralist position in that it holds that we relate to the world through an irreducible plurality of special-purpose models that are not reducible to a single common denominator or unifiable into a single axiomatic system.  Indeed, if a worldview is anything like an all-encompassing axiomatic system, we do not have anything so global as a worldview at all.  Instead, we triangulate the world by deploying various models, each of which is good enough for particular things.  In some cases, like successful scientific theories, these models are very good indeed, and apply very broadly.  However, the partial and idealized character of these models, qua cognitive models, poses barriers to their integration into a single supermodel.  In short, reductionism is not just a thesis about how the world is, it is a thesis about what the mind is like as well:  namely, one that assumes that our various special-purpose representations can be regimented into the form of a single axiomatic system without loss of content or explanatory power.  This hypothesis has two unfortunate characteristics:  it is highly unlikely that God or evolution would build a mind like this, and it seems to be empirically false.  (127-8)

The contentious claim, then, is just that it's likely that the various ways we grasp the world will be "partial" and "idealized" in ways that make integration into a complete picture difficult or impossible.  Exactly how likely this is depends, I think, on exactly how the relevant sorts of idealization are understood.  Happily, Horst provides a rather substantial discussion of kinds of idealization, distinguishing bracketing, distorting, and approximating idealizations (130-144).  The latter two are most familiar:  distorting and approximating idealizations involve a bit of fiction where the users are well-aware of the use of fiction.  It is far from clear that these are likely or insurmountable features of our cognitive apparatus.  The first category, however, seems more central in this connection.  As Horst notes, this sort is "arguably involved in any scientific model," as it simply involves "the bracketing off of other phenomena that may be at work in vivo" (131).  Such abstraction, by itself, could hardly guarantee a difficulty in finding a unified picture.  But the abstraction of such elements may well prevent such unification.  Horst suggests that a "best case scenario" for unification involving such abstractions would require that the isolated elements be fundamental, independent, and jointly exhaustive (132).  I have no good idea how to assess the likelihood of our attaining models with these desirable features, but thinking about the kinds of barriers to such integration is doubtless a good project to undertake.

There is another element to Cognitive Pluralism, however, that needs emphasis.  This element is frankly metaphysical.  Horst's pluralism is not just about what the mind is like; it is also about the world.  It is not, however, a "realist pluralism" (Horst's term) according to which the various different models simply correspond to different items in reality.  Rather, Horst contrasts that sort of view with his own, which he characterizes "as an extension of cognitivist/idealist or Pragmatist approaches to philosophy of science and metaphysics" (121).  He further remarks:

Whereas realist pluralism sees scientific pluralism as pointing to a plurality at the level of ontological inventory, cognitive and pragmatic pluralism see it as pointing to something about the kinds of thinking and practice that are involved in our constituting a world of objects, both in ordinary thinking and in the sciences.  (122)

Horst's Cognitive Pluralism has affinities with Kantian idealism, as becomes explicit when he writes:

For both Kant and the Cognitive Pluralist, it is a philosophical cardinal sin to reason from a truth-within-a-representational-system (phenomenal world) to a truth-full-stop (noumenal world).  But for Kant this takes just one characteristic form:  to mix the phenomenal and the noumenal by applying the categories to noumena or treating phenomenal truths as noumenal truths.  For the Cognitive Pluralist, there is not one single phenomenal model of the world, but a variety of local models… .  The cardinal sin is far more general:  it is to treat truth-as-represented-in-a-model as truth-full-stop.  (192)

These aspects of Cognitive Pluralism are apt to seem radical to many, and it is not clear that they are well-motivated.  Part of the motivation appears to be that a realist pluralism runs into considerable difficulties; if one thinks there are multiple ways of grasping the world that can't be placed in a single overarching view of that world, one may well be inclined to such a quasi-idealist view.  (Some discussion of this is found on p. 125.)  One point to keep in mind is that it's not clear that one couldn't simply fit them all into a single picture by brute conjunction, but much depends on the details.

This aspect of Cognitive Pluralism has an important bearing on the earlier question of integration.  Insofar as it is possible to make sense of the truth of claims made using these various models, this may involve us in a kind of interpretation that could make integration more likely.  Let me make the point rather crudely and simply.  The pragmatist element of Cognitive Pluralism suggests the following simplified account:  a statement made using a model is true just in case it is in fact useful in the right sorts of ways -- perhaps for "description, prediction, and explanation" (139).  If that is so, however, then insofar as different models are used to relate to the same real-world phenomena, then their actual content is guaranteed to be commensurable in a way that makes for the possibility of integration.  Of course, it may be that there is no overarching way of describing all the "real-world phenomena" and hence no way of providing a general picture.  My point, though, is not that there must be such a general model to be had but, rather, that this underdeveloped aspect of Cognitive Pluralism itself offers a possible way in which one might unify otherwise irreducibly plural claims about the world.

It may be obvious from my review that I find myself unpersuaded by much in Beyond Reduction.  The book is perhaps too sweeping in scope to be persuasive on many points of detail.  Nonetheless, it succeeds in presenting an important alternative vision of science and metaphysics that philosophers of mind and others should take seriously.