Beyond Sets: A Venture in Collection-Theoretic Revisionism

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Nicholas Rescher and Patrick Grim, Beyond Sets: A Venture in Collection-Theoretic Revisionism, Ontos, 2011, 112pp., $84.95 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381009.

Reviewed by G. Aldo Antonelli, University of California, Davis


Set membership is determinate, in the sense that for each element a and set S, it is determinate whether a is a member of S or not. On the other hand, membership in collectivities, as introduced in this short -- but surprisingly rich --book, is possibly indeterminate. Membership in a given collectivity C is defined in terms of possession of a given feature F, so that x C if and only if Fx; if the feature F is itself indeterminate, then there might not be a fact of the matter as to whether x C. Consider for example the collectivities:

· The residents of Hiroshima in 1945 who would be alive today if the US had not dropped the atom bomb

· The tall residents of Pittsburgh

· Atoms in this lump of a transuranic element that will not have decayed 30 days hence

· The collectivities that do not contain themselves as members

Membership in the collectivities above is indeterminate: which residents of Hiroshima would be alive today depends in part on whether any of those who perished would have gone on to murder other residents or whether Truman would have opted for fire-bombing instead; which residents of Pittsburgh count as tall is semantically indeterminate because "tall" is vague; radioactive decay is essentially stochastic; and logic alone shows that it is indeterminate whether the collectivity of all non-self-membered collectivities is or is not a self-member. It is a characteristic feature of collectivities that they can have members under any sort of modality: "actual and potential members, definite and indefinite members, past and future members, members identifiable or unknown" (p. 1).

In Beyond Sets, Rescher and Grim aim to provide at least the beginnings of a theory of collectivities that is as mathematically rigorous and conceptually rewarding as standard theories of sets. Indeed, "Collectivity theory is set theory as it would have been had set theory been developed to suit the breadth of human language, conception, and reasoning regarding pluralities, rather than the specific and restricted needs of mathematics" (p. 5). The focus is not primarily formal, but rather conceptual, and the authors do not provide a formal system or even established principles for reasoning about collectivities. But the book is as intriguing and enjoyable as an exploration into uncharted conceptual territory is ever likely to be.

Let us use the following notational conventions. Given a collectivity C, define the determinate core of C to be the collectivity C* of all those elements that determinately belong to C; further for any proposition A abbreviate "A is determinately true" by dA (so that x C* is equivalent to d(x C). Now, given a defining feature F, let us follow the authors in using the notation [x | Fx] to denote the collectivity of all those x's having feature F (where it is understood that it might be to some degree indeterminate whether x has F). It is to some degree unclear whether one can infer Fy from the statement that y belongs to [x | Fx], or vice-versa. The authors do not tell us, but at least the following conversion rules seem plausible: Fy can be inferred from the statement that y belongs to [x | Fx]*, and conversely the statement that y belongs to [x | Fx] can be inferred from dFy.

Collectivities easily give rise to Russellian-type phenomena. For instance, as we have seen, we can form the collectivity R of those collectivities that are not members of themselves: no direct paradox is forthcoming from this, since the well-known Russellian dialectic concerning R only allows us to conclude that it is indeterminate whether R is a member of R or not. Clearly, this leads directly to a failure of bivalence: Rescher and Grim advocate not only a 3-valued logic as adequate for the treatment of collectivities, but in fact indicate that a 4-valued logic with both truth-value gaps and gluts might be most appropriate for the purpose.

The authors also devote much time and effort to a catalogue of possible sources of indeterminacy for membership in a collectivity: semantic indeterminacy, most commonly associated with vagueness; radical contingency, as for example that resulting from agents' radically free choices; epistemic inaccessibility, as regards for example past facts about which no historical record is available; logical indeterminacy, as for instance those resulting from Russellian-type reasoning; and (perhaps most surprising) vagrant predication, involving predicates that are known to have non-empty extensions but are also such that, by their very nature, no members of the extension can be specifically identified (e.g., "being a person that has passed into total oblivion").

Rescher and Grim take the reader through the "first steps" of collectivity theory, specifying for instance how new collectivities can be obtained from old ones and how determinacy and indeterminacy are passed along in the process. For instance, to any collectivity C we can associate its strong indeterminate complement C′ of those elements that are determinately not members of C (such a collectivity will itself be indeterminate and disjoint from C). Moreover, if C1 and C2 are determinate collectivities, then so are their union and intersection. However, if C1 and C2 are indeterminate, their union and intersection need not be indeterminate. In the first case, the collectivity of the tall residents of Pittsburgh and that of the non-tall residents of Pittsburgh are both indeterminate (because of the vagueness of "tall"), but their union is not, as Pittsburgh residency is sharp. For the second case, consider the two collectivities obtained by the adjunction of some element x to an indeterminate collectivity C and its indeterminate complement C′; their intersection will contain just the single element x and will therefore be determinate. In general, determinate collectivities might have indeterminate sub-collectivities and super-collectivities.

We have seen that with each collectivity C one can associate its determinate core C*; in a similar spirit we can identify the penumbra of C with those members of C not in the core, i.e., the indeterminate members of C. It is tempting to identify a set as a collectivity C such that C = C*; but one of the most surprising results of the book is that -- like all temptations -- this one should be resisted. Consider the collectivity C of all collectivities that are not members of their determinate cores. Rescher and Grim show (p. 49) that by familiar Russellian reasoning, it is logically indeterminate whether such a collectivity is a member of its indeterminate core, and that therefore the determinate core is not itself determinate (and in particular it cannot be identified with a set). For if C is a member of C*, then also C is a member of C (by inclusion), and so C is not a member of its core after all (by definition of C). And if C is not a member of C*, then C is a member of C (by definition of C), and determinately so; so C is a member of C*. (Let us observe that in giving this argument, like elsewhere, Rescher and Grim freely inter-deduce Fy and y [x | Fx].)

Consider instead the collectivity C of all collectivities that are members of their determinate cores. In this case, one can consistently assume that such a collectivity is a member of its determinate core, and one can also consistently assume that it is not. In other words, logic does not settle the question of core self-membership for C, and since only logic can potentially supply an answer, it is indeterminate whether C is a member of C*, with the consequence that "even determinate cores can have penumbral members" (p. 49). This is a style of argumentation that is typical of Rescher and Grim's treatment of collectivities, and it is one of the book's most rewarding features that the authors present us with a real trove of such engaging arguments.

Perhaps one of the most interesting potential applications of collectivity theory is to the analysis of plena. (The treatment here overlaps that of the authors' article "Plenum Theory," which appeared in Noûs vol. 42(3), 2008, pp. 422-39.) Plena are "oversize collectivities that are as large as their own power set" (p. 59), for instance the collectivity comprising absolutely everything or the collectivities comprising all facts, propositions, or states of affairs. In more detail, a collectivity C is a plenum if there is a one-to-one mapping m taking sub-collectivities of C into C. A collectivity is a membership plenum if the mapping m is the identity function: in the authors' notation, a membership plenum is a collectivity P such that [x | x P] P. Because of Cantor's theorem, plena are so large that they cannot be assigned a cardinal number. The collectivity of all facts, for instance, is arguably a plenum, and indeed a membership plenum: given any collectivity of facts, it is a (unique) fact that the facts in the given collectivity all obtain, and indeed one can argue that any collectivity of facts just is a fact (which would make the fact collectivity a membership plenum). A collectivity defined by the stipulation that it contains all items of a certain kind is called a totality; plenary totalities (totalities that are also plena) are of particular interest to philosophers (the totality of all facts, truths, propositions, etc.).

The collectivity C of all self-membered collectivities is not a membership plenum: for among its sub-collectivities is the empty one, which has no members, and hence is not a self-member, and so it is not a member of C. It is, on the other hand, indeterminate whether the collectivity of all non­-self-membered collectivities is a membership plenum (although this does not rule out that it might be a plenum of some other sort). It is important to notice that plena are not closed under unions: indeed, even the adjunction of one single element to a plenum might result in a collectivity that is no longer a plenum, as the new sub-collectivities thus obtained might not have a representative.

There is much more in the book than can be usefully surveyed here. Let us rather conclude this review by mentioning two technical points of potential concern. The first, relatively minor, concerns the question of whether unions of determinate collectivities are always determinate. It's easy to show, as the authors do on pp. 43-44, that the union of any two determinate collectivities will again be determinate, and this of course extends to the union of any finite number of determinate collectivities.

However, on p. 45 the authors give an argument to the effect that every indeterminate collectivity C must have a proper sub-collectivity that is also indeterminate: for if not, the union of all sub-collectivities of C, which is just C, would be determinate. This argument seems to appeal to a generalized version of the finitary case ("the union of determinate collectivities must be determinate"), but it seems doubtful whether the argument for the finitary case does indeed carry over to the general case: the union of a collectivity C of determinate collectivities will not in general be itself determinate unless C itself is determinate. For how does one determine if some x is a member of the union of C? One needs to check whether there is a C′ in C such that x is a member of C′, but if C is not itself determinate (even if every C in C is), the question might not have a determinate answer. The issue does not arise, supposedly, in the finitary case, because any finite collectivity explicitly given in the form {a, b, c, … } will indeed be determinate. Of course, this observation does not preclude the truth of the claim that every indeterminate collectivity has an indeterminate proper sub-collectivity, but only indicates that a separate argument would be needed.

The second issue is more worrisome, and concerns the way this account of collectivities deals with the threat of paradox. The key to avoid both Russell's and Cantor's paradoxes, according to the authors, is the failure of bivalence brought about by the indeterminacy of collectivities. As we have seen, the Russellian dialectic leads to the conclusion that it is indeterminate whether the collectivity R of all non-self-membered collectivities is self-membered. Similarly, for Cantor's paradox, given a hypothetical one-to-one mapping assigning an element of C to each sub-collectivity of C, it is indeterminate whether the object x assigned to the collectivity C′ of those y's that are not members of the collectivity that maps to them is or is not a member of C (see for instance the Noûs paper mentioned above).

But not all routes to paradox detour through negation, so that renouncing bivalence might not provide insurance against all logical pathologies. In particular, the following version of Curry's paradox seems to sidestep any pre-emptive move in terms of indeterminacy or failure of bivalence. Let B be an arbitrary proposition, and define C = [D | D D* B]. So C is the collectivity of those collectivities such that their determinate self-membership implies B. We will make use of the conversion rules mentioned above, although as we have seen Rescher and Grim freely employ the unrestricted version throughout.

Assume (1) C C* as a hypothesis, i.e., (2) d(C C). Then by definition of C we have (3) C C* B. Now (1) and (3) by modus ponens give (4) B. Discharging the hypothesis (1) we obtain (5) C C* B, moreover this conclusion is obtained from the definition of C by logic and the conversion rules alone, so that (6) d(C C* B). By the conversion rules this gives (7) C C. Again this conclusion is obtained by logic alone from the definition of C, hence (8) d(C C), i.e., (9) C C*. But now by modus ponens from (5) and (9) we obtain (10), B.

The above argument does not point to a genuine trivialization of collectivity theory, if only because the authors have not given us a formal system in which such reasoning is to be carried out. However, there does not seem to be any role that the assumption of bivalence plays in the above trivialization argument, so that the escape route from Russell's and Cantor's paradoxes employed by the authors does not seem to be available in this case. Moreover, the reasoning is completely elementary, employing the same kind of moves that the authors apply time and again in the book to obtain some of their results.

Only three possible counter-moves seem to be available: (1) one can further restrict the conversion rules given above; or (2) switch from the material conditional to some kind of intensional implication; or finally (3) restrict the comprehension principle for collectivities that is implicit in the argument (and throughout the book).

As regards (1) let us observe that the conversion rules employed were formulated in such a way as to be as unassailable as possible: the inference from Fy to y ∈ [x | Fx], or vice-versa, is allowed only when the premise in each case is determinately true. As for (2), a switch to an intensional conditional is certainly an option, but the kind of hypothetical reasoning involved in the collectivity C above is so basic (essentially just modus ponens and conditional proof) that it would be hard -- and perhaps undesirable -- to find a reading of the conditional on which those would fail. And, finally, of course one could explore option (3) and restrict the principle of comprehension for collectivities: as one of the authors puts it, "our aim throughout was to make room for collectivities beyond sets. At no point was the goal to defend an unrestricted axiom of comprehension for collectivities" (P. Grim, personal communication). The challenge is to find a principled way to do this. Rejecting the collectivity C simply because it leads to trivialization is an effective although ad hoc option.