Beyond the Analytic-Continental Divide: Pluralist Philosophy in the Twenty-First Century

Placeholder book cover

Jeffrey A. Bell, Andrew Cutrofello, and Paul M. Livingston (eds.), Beyond the Analytic-Continental Divide: Pluralist Philosophy in the Twenty-First Century, Routledge, 2016, 334pp., $148.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138787360.

Reviewed by David Lauer, Christian-Albrechts-Universität zu Kiel


The editors of this collection begin their introductory chapter by declaring that the "divide" between analytic and continental philosophy "still largely shapes and constrains philosophical work in the English-speaking world" (p.1). This diagnosis seems indisputable, and I would add that it holds for much of the non-English-speaking world as well.

This situation prevails (a) despite the fact that the spuriousness of the analytic/continental distinction has long been the target of trenchant criticism from both sides. It is impossible at this point not to allude, once more, to Bernard Williams's famous quip that the distinction is as well-grounded as that between cars with a four-wheel drive and those manufactured in Japan -- i.e. not well grounded at all. It prevails (b) despite the fact that the history of analytic philosophy, as a philosophical discipline, has come a long way in unearthing the deep common roots of analytic philosophy and its 20th-century siblings -- phenomenology, hermeneutics, and structuralism -- as different yet closely related responses to the heritage of Hegelianism and Neo-Kantianism. This "parting of the ways" (Michael Friedman) never constituted a rupture, a chasm in the course of the history of philosophy, as some early flag bearers of the analytic movement wished to believe. Lastly, the situation prevails (c) despite the fact that there is an ever-growing body of highly successful bridge-building attempts between the traditions: books that make authors or positions from one side of the divide accessible to philosophers at home on the other side, by showing that despite all differences in terminology, context and style, what those authors have to offer is not outlandish gibberish or technical fetishism, respectively, but rather the serious outcome of rigorous thinking on the fundamental questions of philosophy -- neither analytic, nor continental, but philosophy tout court.

Faced with the fact that all these developments have done little to break the considerable sway that the analytic/continental distinction holds over many philosophers' minds, Jeffrey A. Bell, Andrew Cutrofello and Paul M. Livingston want to pursue a different approach. The thirteen essays collected here are presented as exemplary of a new style of thought they self-confidently term "synthetic philosophy" (p. 2). They write:

Rather than attempting simply to comprehend the divide or place into dialogue two traditions still conceived as essentially distinct, the essays in this volume situate themselves beyond the divide in that they operate in a context wherein the divide is no longer assumed to determine or constrain philosophical thought or inquiry.  . . .  the essays in this volume pose and re-open longstanding philosophical questions and provide positive directives for future work on them in a pluralist context beyond the limitations of the analytic-continental divide, a context that is already -- as the work collected here attests -- recognizably 'ours' today. (pp. 2-3)

Thus, instead of collecting further attempts to bridge the analytic/continental divide from either side, Bell, Cutrofello and Livingston propose to present and thereby foster a kind of philosophical writing that has simply left the divide behind, a kind of philosophical writing in which the distinction is simply passed over as posing no relevant philosophical constraint any longer. I consider this an excellent and admirable objective. It is, however, also the standard against which the content of the volume is to be assessed. In this respect, I think the book succeeds only partially, and I will try to explain why.

Let me first note that the subject matters covered by the essays are diverse, to say the least. Considering the breadth of the volume's overarching topic, this should come as no surprise. The editors divide the book into four parts: "Methodologies", "Truth and Meaning", "Metaphysics and Ontology", and "Values, Personhood and Agency". However, this order seems relatively contingent, as shown by the fact that the editors do not even mention these sections in their introduction. The real problem, however, is that quite a few of the essays do not (or not quite) represent the kind of "synthetic" philosophy the editors envisage. This does not mean that they do not represent interesting philosophical work. But it does mean that the product on offer does not quite live up to what was advertised. There is, for example, a considerable number of papers that precisely follow the bridge-building script that the editors, in their introduction, characterize as not being what they intended: one author from the analytic tradition and one author from the continental tradition are paired together, their ideas and arguments concerning a particular problem translated into a vocabulary that resembles the philosophical vernacular spoken on the other side of the divide, and similarities and dissimilarities between the emerging views put on record.

Thus we find Lee Braver ("Reasons, Epistemic Truth, and History") comparing Hilary Putnam's internal realism and Michel Foucault's conceptual genealogy, portraying them both as heirs of Kant's critique of absolute realism, and coming to the unsurprising conclusion that their positions turn out to be remarkably similar. (To be fair, Braver also argues that Foucault's position is in fact superior to Putnam's, as he manages to leave behind even those deep-seated realist intuitions that Putnam cannot free himself from.) In a similar vein, Richard Eldridge and Tamsin Lorraine ("Philosophy as Articulation") trace the similarities in J. L. Austin's and Gilles Deleuze's understanding of philosophy as not primarily analyzing, but rather developing and indeed creating concepts. Samuel C. Wheeler III ("Metaphor Without Meanings") offers a parallel reading of Jacques Derrida's and Donald Davidson's seminal essays on metaphor (finding that they agree on fundamental issues and that their respective arguments supplement and strengthen each other). Livingston ("Wittgenstein Reads Heidegger, Heidegger Reads Wittgenstein") offers a detailed exposition and interpretation of the only two significant remarks in which the two philosophers featured in his title ever officially acknowledged their acquaintance with the other's work, showing how both of them failed to understand the concerns of the other. Finally, Dan Zahavi and Glenda Satne ("Varieties of Shared Intentionality") seek to enrich and broaden the debate on collective intentionality by rehearsing some valuable distinctions between forms of "we-consciousness" developed by classical phenomenologists, especially Gerda Walther and Alfred Schütz, while Catarina Dutilh Novaes's "Conceptual Genealogy for Analytic Philosophers" presents an introduction for analytic philosophers to (her own version of) Nietzschean conceptual genealogy, Georges Canguilhem's historical epistemology, and Foucaultian discourse analysis, along with the claim that analytic philosophy has much to gain from taking seriously these kinds of considerations.

Some of these contributions -- one could especially single out Livingston's and Dutilh Novaes's papers -- are of very high quality, and none falls below decent, even though one or two carry obvious signs of having been pieced together from work that was originally presented elsewhere. What cannot be ignored, however, is that none of these contributions strays in any significant way from the well-trodden path of dealing with the analytic/synthetic divide sketched above. James Conant's long meditation on the question of what analytic philosophy is, while characteristically far-reaching and illuminating, has also little to do with the editors' conception of "synthetic philosophy". Taking the reader through some of the most important stages in the development of the self-conception of the analytic movement, Conant concludes that the unity of analytic philosophy is to be found "not at the level of the doctrines, or the conception of philosophy, or the style of the writing of its practitioners, but rather in the manner in which it forms a distinctive tradition of thought" (55). Since a tradition of thought is something that exists by being self-consciously inherited, appropriated, and carried further by its heirs, this implies that analytic philosophy needs to acknowledge that it is, after all, just a specific tradition of philosophy alongside others, and that it needs to understand its own history if it is to understand itself.

On the positive side, there are papers in the volume that do succeed in offering glimpses of how a "synthetic" philosophy, as anticipated by the editors, could look. These are among the most rewarding and thought-provoking contributions -- not because their claims are always perfectly clear or meticulously argued, but because one reads them with a feeling of excitement about the originality of the thoughts presented. If there is room for complaint here, it is that some of them are simply too short to present more than a first sketch and would need further elaboration in order to fully convince. David Woodruff Smith ("Truth and Epoché") uses Tarski's semantical conception of truth in order to give a clear and innovative interpretation of Husserl's famous method of "epoché" (bracketing), while at the same time incorporating Tarski's definition into a much broader phenomenological conception of human intentionality. Bell ("From Difference-Maker to Truthmaker and Back") argues that Deleuze's metaphysics offers the conceptual resources needed to construct the sort of language- and thought-independent ontology sought by so-called "truthmaker theory" (as, e.g., in the writings of David Armstrong, David Lewis, Jonathan Schaffer, and others) that would be necessary to defend a version of metaphysical realism. John McCumber ("Why Is Time Different From Space?") tries to account for the difference and interrelation of time and space by showing them to spring from a common root which McCumber calls "place" and defines it as "a dynamic set of approaches and retreats that are determined as such with respect to a sentient body" (203). He introduces the terms "nearings" and "farings" for these motions and argues that by taking them as basic, one is able to show "how and why space and time fall out of them" (204).

Graham Priest, in a very short contribution (hardly more than a note, actually) on "The Answer to the Question of Being", brings his own brand of paraconsistent logic and "gluon theory" to bear on Heidegger's famous question of what it is to be, claiming that Heidegger was right to maintain that being is both a thing and a non-thing we equally can and cannot speak of. Cutrofello ("Revolutionary Actions and Events") uses J.M.E. McTaggart's philosophy of time in order to develop an eye-opening account of Alain Badiou's concept of the revolutionary event in comparison with Hannah Arendt's conception of revolutionary action while blending this analysis with Lewis's philosophy of possible worlds. Finally, Carol Rovane, in what is perhaps the most even-balanced contribution ("Relativism and Recognition"), reopens the question of moral relativism, which she defines as the question whether moral judgments, if true, are true for everyone. She distinguishes this question from the independent question of whether specific moral judgments are "objective", that is, adequate responses to the moral demands of a specific group of people in a specific historical situation. She calls the position that answers the first question affirmatively "unimundialism", its adversary "multimundialism". In the grand panorama that ensues, analytic multimundialists such as Bernard Williams and Rorty make their entrance next to continental unimundialists such as Kant, Marx, and Habermas. Rovane ends with a critical discussion of Axel Honneth's philosophy of recognition, arguing that multimundialism, as she recommends it, does in fact rest on a universalist conception of the mutual recognition between persons, while still maintaining that "we do not all face the same moral problems, and as a result, we do not all require the same moral truths to live by" (264).

To sum up: Many of the papers in this collection merit close and sustained attention. In consequence, so does the volume. But it is as individual units rather than as exemplars of an alleged general genre (called "philosophy beyond the analytic/continental divide") that the papers recommend themselves. Concerning the latter, one cannot help feeling that the editors have placed themselves in something of a quandary. One is reminded of the later Heidegger here. Self-critically looking back on his own former attempts at "overcoming metaphysics" (the goal he shared with Carnap, ironically), he noted that even in the intention to overcome something, the reality and pertinence of that thing is inescapably once again reaffirmed and hence fortified. Famously, Heidegger concluded (in his essay "Time and Being") that "our task is to cease all overcoming, and leave metaphysics to itself". It does not seem far-fetched to say that what the editors envisage is a kind of philosophy that has left the analytic/continental distinction to itself in this way. But then, the idea of putting together a volume to single out philosophical work for no other reason than that it exemplifies the attitude in question cannot escape the air of mild inconsistency.

Maybe we can all agree that what we should strive for is a philosophical culture in which the attitude of granting equal rights to the philosophical voices of all traditions is not regarded as something deserving special praise and metaphilosophical comment, but as a simple matter of course, something that goes without saying. But what is needed to make progress on our way to such a philosophical culture -- one that could truly be said to have moved "beyond" the analytic/continental divide -- is not special volumes devoted to the topic (like the one under review), but rather a change in the way that normal philosophical volumes are conceived and written, or rather, a change in what principles for putting together philosophical volumes are considered "normal". What we should work for is a culture in which the plan to publish a companion volume to, say, 20th century philosophy of language, with chapters on Frege, Russell, Wittgenstein, Carnap, Quine, Austin, and Kripke, and another one on "Continental Philosophy of Language" (lumping together Saussure, Derrida, Benjamin, Gadamer and Levinas), as if the latter was something completely different from and alien to, well, real philosophy of language, would be rejected as strictly untenable and downright bizarre. It would also be a culture in which we would open a philosophical book on the subject of time, for example, and be surprised not to find references to McTaggart and Bergson, Prior and Deleuze; a culture in which the author of the book wouldn't even think of highlighting this as a special feat of her work in the foreword.  It is in books such as these, one imagines, that the best of the essays in this volume would -- and should -- seamlessly fit.