Beyond the Control of God?: Six Views on the Problem of God and Abstract Objects

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Paul M. Gould (ed.), Beyond the Control of God?: Six Views on the Problem of God and Abstract Objects, Bloomsbury, 2014, 209pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781623563653.

Reviewed by William Hasker, Huntington University


For theistically-minded philosophers, the problem of God and abstract objects has been heating up. The problem is motivated by an inconsistent triad of propositions, nicely formulated by Greg Welty:

1. Abstract objects (AOs) exist.

2. If AOs exist, they are dependent on God.

3. If AOs exist, they are independent of God. (81)

The first proposition is motivated by well-known arguments for the existence of abstract objects. The second is motivated by the theistic doctrines of creation and divine aseity: everything other than God must be created by God or depend on God. The third proposition is motivated by considerations suggesting that AOs, if they exist, are not the sorts of things that could be created or could depend on anything for their existence. Paul Gould's edited book updates the state of play, and can serve as an excellent introduction to the debate for those of us who have not been following it closely. After Gould's introduction, there are six major contributions, each followed by critiques from each of the other contributors and a final rejoinder from the main author of the section. We have "God and Propositions," by Keith Yandell, "Modified Theistic Activism," by Paul M. Gould and Richard Brian Davis; "Theistic Conceptual Realism," by Greg Welty; "Anti-Platonism," by William Lane Craig; "God with or without Abstract Objects," by Scott A. Shalkowski, and "Abstract Objects? Who Cares!" by Graham Oppy.

Any contributor to the debate must reject at least one of the three inconsistent propositions. None of our authors takes the route of rejecting (2) by rejecting theism. (Oppy is of course an atheist, but not for that reason.) The sections fall into four broad categories, allowing for some vagueness and overlapping: Yandell is a platonist, rejecting (2); Craig an anti-platonist, rejecting (1); Welty and (in important respects) Gould and Davis are "divine conceptualists," rejecting (3); while Shalkowski and Oppy can perhaps be termed "indifferentists," holding that both platonism and anti-platonism are entirely compatible with theism; they seem to hold that neither (1) nor (2) is compellingly motivated.

For purposes of this review, "abstract objects" can best be specified by enumeration: they comprise concepts, propositions, possible worlds, properties, relations, and mathematical objects. (Which of these are properly "abstract," and under what interpretations, is one of the topics in debate.) Propositions get a bit more of the action than the other categories, but all of the categories are discussed in one or another selection. With this in place, we proceed to consider the different contributions.

Yandell's view is simply stated: God exists; there are propositions; and propositions don't depend on God. (Yandell speaks only of propositions, but presumably could take similar positions with regard to other varieties of abstract objects.) This could, I think, be fairly described as a sort of default position in the debate. It accepts standard arguments for the existence of propositions, arguments that many philosophers find persuasive. On the other hand, the various ways in which propositions (and other abstract objects) may be claimed to depend on God seem somewhat problematic, so a view may be so far better off if it is unencumbered with such claims. Furthermore, the view does not require any special conception of God, over and above the standard, minimal theistic package (omnipotence, omniscience, perfect goodness, and the like). In particular, it does not require a decision as to whether God's existence is logically necessary or logically contingent. In his own view, Yandell opts for contingent, but that is not forced upon him by his theistic propositionalism. As opposed to these advantages, there is the objection that the view compromises the doctrine of creation and, ultimately, theism itself.

That objection is urged most emphatically by Craig, drawing upon Scripture (I Cor. 8:6, Rom. 11:36, Jn. 1:1), the Nicene Creed ("maker of . . . all things visible and invisible"), and patristic tradition. His project here is to defend "anti-platonism," the view that the platonic horde simply does not exist. Craig is not firmly committed to anti-platonism, but he thinks it deserves more consideration than it usually receives. His defense has two main prongs: first, the use of referring expressions and existential statements do not in general necessitate serious metaphysical commitment to the kinds of objects mentioned. And second, when we do find ourselves referring to abstract entities (as in mathematics), that reference can be given a fictionalist interpretation. Both these claims, however, fall short of making a full case for the anti-platonist position. While no particular linguistic expression may as such require full ontological commitment, we must sooner or later say something that commits us ontologically, and the question is whether we won't in the end need to be committed to abstract entities. With fictionalism there is the problem, noted by Yandell, of where the fictions will end. If we are not satisfied with "fictions all the way down," we must eventually come to saying something that is seriously intended as true -- and what will that something be? Now, Craig can't be expected to say everything in a brief piece, so this is hardly a severe criticism. I think it could be an important contribution to the discussion if Craig were to mount a full-scale (perhaps book-length) defense of his preferred version of anti-platonism.

Welty's "theistic conceptual realism" argues that

the platonistic tradition can accommodate AOs being necessarily dependent on God, in virtue of their being uncreated divine ideas that "play the role" of AOs with respect to all created reality. . . . I maintain that AOs are constitutively dependent on God, for they are constituted by the divine ideas, which inhere in the divine mind and have no existence outside of it (81).

The case for the view develops as follows. Welty first deploys several arguments for the existence of AOs, in particular for propositions and possible worlds. From these arguments he derives several requirements for the sort of entity that can fulfill the role of AOs. A key insight here is that propositions are intentional; they represent reality as being a certain way. But of course the same thing can be said about thoughts; thoughts also are intentional, and represent reality as being such-and-such. This suggests that AOs ought to be understood as thoughts of some kind. Human thoughts, however, won't do the job. They are contingent, not necessary as propositions and PWs need to be. And there are not enough of them; there are infinitely many propositions that never have been and never will be thought by any human being. A solution, however, lies ready to hand:

First, a divine mind (being omniscient) can certainly have enough thoughts for all the truths and propositions we intuitively think there are. Second, if necessarily existent thoughts are required, they must be the thoughts of a necessarily existing mind (88).

This mind, of course, must be the mind of God, which thus provides a solution to our quest for the nature of AOs. Furthermore, neither platonic realism nor nominalism provides an equally good solution. Platonic realism is not as simple as divine conceptualism, for in addition to all the ordinary sorts of entities it posits a "third realm" beyond the material and the mental, something which divine conceptualism need not embrace. Even nominalism is not as simple as it appears to be. As replacements for AOs it offers such items as concrete human sentences and inscriptions, but sentences are intentional only in virtue of their relation to thoughts: their intentionality is derived rather than intrinsic. Divine conceptualism appeals directly to the thoughts, thus rendering otiose the invocation of linguistic expressions for this purpose. And since theism in this way provides the best solution for the otherwise baffling philosophical problem of the nature of AOs, this line of thought also constitutes a good argument for the existence of God.

Gould and Davis's "modified theistic activism" is the most complex of the views presented. With regard to concepts and propositions, their view is similar to Welty's divine conceptualism. (There are however minor differences, one of which will concern us later on.) But the "modified theistic activism" label pertains especially to their view of properties and relations, which cannot, they argue, be treated in the same way as concepts and propositions. The original theistic activism, proposed by Thomas Morris and Christopher Menzel, holds simply that the elements in the platonic multitude are one and all created by God, thus safeguarding divine creativity, sovereignty, and aseity. This view, it is generally conceded, cannot possibly be right, mainly because of the "bootstrapping problem." In order for God to create properties, he must already have properties, in particular the property of being able to create properties. Gould and Davis avoid this pitfall by asserting that "God's essential platonic properties exist a se (i.e., they are neither created nor sustained by God, yet they inhere in the divine substance" (62). This is the modification, but they remain theistic activists in maintaining that all other properties (those not essential to God) are indeed created by God. (They argue that the notion of eternal creation, and thus of God's creation of necessarily existing properties, makes good sense.) This then creates a bifurcation in the realm of properties, between those that are essential to God, and thus inherent in the divine substance, and those that are not, but are rather created by God. Making this distinction in detail promises to be a challenging undertaking, and could yield some unlikely-looking results. For example, oneness (there is only one God), twoness (the Father is distinct from the Son), and threeness (of the divine Persons) all seem clearly to be essential to the being of God. It doesn't seem, however, that higher levels of numerosity will be essential in the same way. The mathematician Kronecker famously remarked, "God made the integers." Now, it seems, we need an asterisk, explaining that the remark does not apply to the integers one, two, and three!

Both Oppy and Shalkowski seek to dispel the perceived conflict between abstract objects and the nature of God. Their strategies for doing so, however, are different. For Shalkowski, the key insight is that abstract objects, if they exist, are necessary. Necessity, he urges, constitutes the end point for any explanation, so it signals no deficiency in God that God does not provide the explanation for something that inherently can't be explained. Likewise, what is necessary is what absolutely could not be otherwise, so God is not deficient for being unable to make otherwise something that intrinsically must be just as it is. It does not seem, though, that this can by itself be a full solution. It just is not the case that anything whatever could turn out to be absolutely necessary, without this conflicting with what is believed about God. A necessarily existing devil, I should think, would constitute a real problem, as would necessarily existing Platonic Forms. (Given the latter, God could be wise and good only by participating in the Forms of wisdom and goodness.) In all likelihood Shalkowski doesn't think the devil, or Platonic Forms, are plausible candidate for entities that exist necessarily. But this makes my point: the appeal to necessity does not by itself suffice to remove all possible conflicts; there must also be consideration of what sorts of things there might be that could exist necessarily.

Oppy's concise but tightly-packed essay comes the closest of any of the contributions to offering a systematic survey of the territory in dispute. He begins by making a sharp distinction between Causal Reality and Abstract Reality, thus excluding from the outset the possibility that abstract objects could enter into causal relationships. (Thus, the devil and Platonic Forms would not be candidates.) He identifies realism and fictionalism as the viable competing accounts of Abstract Reality, arguing that conceptualism and tokenism are not genuine alternatives. Officially, he takes no position as between realism and fictionalism, though there are indications that he leans towards the latter. His main conclusion is "that realism and fictionalism give no differential support to either theism or naturalism, and that there are no other plausible accounts of Abstract Reality" (181). For fictionalism this is obvious: if there are no abstract objects, they cannot provide a basis for arguing for or against theism and naturalism. Oppy contends, furthermore, that they cannot provide such a basis even if realism is true:

according to realism, the only connections between Abstract Reality and Causal Reality are necessary connections. . . . Since Pure Abstract Reality is absolutely independent of Causal Reality, and since -- ex hypothesi -- theism and naturalism differ fundamentally only in their accounts of Causal Reality, it is impossible for considerations about Pure Abstract Reality to favor one view over the other (175).

In concluding, Oppy briefly considers, and rejects, several arguments for theism based on abstract objects suggested by Alvin Plantinga.

Regrettably, but unsurprisingly, the result of this systematic approach is to bring out even more sharply the large range of disagreements concerning these topics. Gould and Davis, as well as Welty, take Oppy to task for assuming that abstract objects cannot enter into causal relations. Yandell suggests that there are after all some interesting argumentative connections between the existence of God and that of abstract objects. Craig insists that neither theism nor naturalism, rightly considered, is compatible with realism concerning abstract objects; Oppy has arrived at his contrary view only by watering down both theism and naturalism. Summing up: consensus not only has not been reached, it's not even dimly visible on the horizon.

A few additional thoughts suggest themselves. I think we might well dial back a bit on the notion that theism and even the Christian faith are at stake in this debate. The exegetical argument seems really quite weak. No one maintains that the apostles or the church fathers had in mind our contemporary array of abstract objects, so we are forced to fall back on what we think they would have concluded on the topic -- perhaps after taking a course on the subject at Oxford or Notre Dame. (Almost certainly they would have accepted the correct conclusions, namely one's own). Even if the arguments for indifferentism do not command universal support, it seems likely that both theists and naturalists will soldier on regardless of what conclusion is ultimately reached about abstract objects. Anti-platonism (fictionalism, nominalism) offers theoretical economy, but its adequacy is widely questioned, and those questions are not readily explored or resolved in short selections such as the ones in the present volume. Most theistic philosophers seem to be leery of such views, but perhaps their objections could be overcome by a full-fledged and convincing defense.

Divine conceptualism also claims ontological economy, but we need to recognize the theoretical burden it carries. If propositions are logically necessary entities, it follows that God, on whom they depend, must also be necessary. If so, then perhaps, as Yandell suggests, we should be worried by the widely acknowledged lack of a successful ontological argument. But further: since propositions exist only in the divine mind, it is logically necessary that God is constantly thinking (or is timelessly thinking) every one of those propositions. This means, as Oppy points out, that God necessarily is thinking "bawdy thoughts, banal thoughts, malicious thoughts, silly thoughts, and so forth" (105). And God will be thinking these thoughts whether or not there are ever any creatures who might also be thinking them! (Welty observes that God "doesn't intend those thoughts as we intend them" (110).) Then there is the vast multitude of propositions suggested by Plantinga, such as the proposition with regard to each real number r that it is distinct from the Taj Mahal. There are also a significant number of propositions entertained by humans that are logically incoherent, involve category mistakes, and the like. (Think here of your favorite example of an fascinating-but-ultimately-incoherent philosophical theory.) The notion that God is constantly thinking all of these propositions does not seem particularly attractive. But if it is logically necessary that God thinks them, then he has no choice about it! Gould and Davis offer an interesting alternative here:

The best way to look at things, perhaps, is to see we human beings as arranging our ideas -- which are sometimes complete, but often only partial graspings of God's ideas -- into thoughts which approximate (to varying degrees) those of God himself. We can then reserve the term "proposition" for referring to God's thoughts (59).

This allows God to be selective about the thoughts that he thinks, but it means that some of our human thoughts -- perhaps a good number of them -- are not propositions at all, and thus presumably are not really true or false. An intriguing possibility!

Clearly, there are a lot of moving parts in this discussion; achieving simplicity along one dimension often brings with it unanticipated complexity in other respects. The essays in Beyond the Control of God? may not point us to a clear solution, but they enable to see a lot of what is at stake in the controversy. Highly recommended.