Beyond the Dynamical Universe: Unifying Block Universe Physics and Time as Experienced

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Michael Silberstein, W.M. Stuckey, and Timothy McDevitt, Beyond the Dynamical Universe: Unifying Block Universe Physics and Time as Experienced, Oxford University Press, 2018, 431pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198807087.

Reviewed by Bradford Skow, Massachusetts Institute of Technology


"A philosopher, a physicist, and a mathematician walk into a bar." Maybe a decent start to a joke, but a wonderful idea for a book. The foundations of physics are full of problems and puzzles; to solve them, researchers in these three disciplines are going to need to talk to each other. If a physicist wanders into philosophical territory unprepared, the results are not going to be good -- and, of course, vice-versa.

The authors of this book -- Michael Silberstein, the philosopher; W.M. Stuckey, the physicist; and Timothy McDevitt, the mathematician (I will refer to them collectively as SSM) -- are not unprepared. They know an intimidating amount of physics and philosophy. They've got the background they need for this project.

Things look so promising! The book, unfortunately, is not very good. SSM don't say enough about one of their main ideas. And many parts of the book are poorly written, to the point where often I could not understand their view.

SSM think that two ideas can help answer a whole bunch of questions in physics and philosophy. The questions include, why did the universe start in a low entropy state? Why is the cosmic background radiation the same temperature in all directions? Does the quantum wavefunction ever collapse? How do entangled quantum systems coordinate their behavior? Why do we experience the passage of time the way we do? And many, many more.

So what are the two ideas that are so powerful that they can help answer such an intimidating list of questions? The first is an idea about the nature of time: SSM urge us to accept the "block universe" theory of time. The block universe theory says, roughly, that past and future things and events, not just present ones, exist, and that there is nothing "objectively" special about the present. The second idea is about the nature of explanation: SSM hold that the most fundamental kind of explanation is "adynamical," rather than dynamical. By "dynamical explanation" SSM have in mind cases where you explain why one thing happened by mentioning some earlier thing, and some dynamical laws. If you ask why the moon is in such-and-such a place, and the answer offered is that last year the moon was in this other place, and the laws of planetary motion say that if it was in that other place a year ago then it will be in such-and-such a place now, then you've been given a dynamical explanation. So what is an adynamical explanation? Roughly speaking, adynamical explanations differ from dynamical ones in two ways. First, the factor doing the explaining need not be earlier than the phenomenon being explained. Second, the laws invoked must be adynamical "global constraint" laws, rather than dynamical laws. (Laws of motion in "Hamiltonian" form are paradigm cases of dynamical laws, while laws in "Lagrangian" form are paradigm adynamical laws.)

The block universe theory of time is relatively popular, but the idea that there are adynamical explanations is quite radical. SSM in fact think of themselves as revolutionaries:

a move from the NSU [accepting only dynamical explanations] to the LSU [accepting adynamical explanations] . . . requires a dramatic change in the scientific worldview . . . A change of this magnitude . . . what in the past has been called a 'Kuhnian revolution' . . . hasn't occurred since we ascended from Aristotle's teleological universe to Newton's mechanical universe in 1687. (17)

SSM are ready to proclaim themselves the Newtons of adynamical explanation.

Since SSM hold that accepting that there are adynamical explanations is a leap forward akin to figuring out that F=ma, it is worth dwelling for a second more on what adynamical explanations (if they exist) look like. If I throw a rock and it breaks a window, then, SSM write,

the dynamical explanation for the broken window would ultimately reside in the rock's initial position and initial velocity given Newton's laws and the force of gravity, while the adynamical explanation would ultimately reside in the initial and final positions of the rock, given the adynamical global constraint that the path connecting those locations is an extremum of the action. (15)

So, to be clear, SSM here seem to assert that

The window broke because I threw a rock at it (and Newton's laws are such-and-such)

is true (and a dynamical explanation), and also that

The window broke because earlier the rock was here and later the rock was there (and the constraint laws are such-and-such)

is true (and an adynamical explanation). It really is necessary to register how wild this idea is. I myself, at least, think that the first claim is true but that the second is certainly false. The later position of the rock is not part of why the window broke. In fact I've never seen any purported explanation (sentence of the form "P because Q") that (i) satisfied SSM's criteria for being an adynamical explanation, and (ii) seemed even likely to be true. SSM's attitude, I think, is that I should loosen up, that once I see how many problems go away by accepting that there can be adynamical explanations, I should be willing to accept that there are. This, as far as I can tell, is their main argument for the existence of adynamical explanations.

After introducing the block universe theory and the idea of adynamical explanation in Part I, SSM, in part II, show what work recognizing the existence of adynamical explanation can do in physics. First up is a defense of the block universe theory of time. SSM don't have a new argument; instead they aim to show that the classic Putnam-Rietdijk argument succeeds. SSM comprehensively review responses to the Putnam-Rietdijk argument that presentists (and other anti-block universe theory folks) have given, and suggest that each response is bad. But SSM do not think that close attention to those responses is where the real action is:

we believe that the best reason to believe in the block universe is not RoS [relativity of simultaneity] alone [that is, the Putnam-Rietdijk argument] . . . but is instead the work that the block universe and adynamical global explanation can do more generally in resolving problems in the foundations of physics, foundational physics, and metaphysics . . . it is the book as a whole that constitutes our argument for the block universe. (64)

Okay then: let's take a look at the rest.

In the rest of Part II SSM take up problems in general relativity, quantum mechanics, quantum field theory, and quantum gravity. They claim that all these problems may be resolved by accepting the existence of adynamical explanations. The stuff on quantum field theory and quantum gravity is beyond my ability to evaluate, so I'll stick to GR and QM. Here are a few problems in general relativity: physicists' best measurements suggest that (i) the universe is almost perfectly (spatially) flat, and that (ii) the cosmic background radiation is pretty much the same temperature in all directions. Also, it is common to accept that (iii) the universe started off (at the big bang) in a very low entropy state. But all of (i) through (iii) are (in some sense) exceedingly unlikely. So their truth immediately raises the question of why they are true.

Some physicists appeal to "inflationary cosmology" to answer the question of why (i) and (ii) are true. Inflation describes a mechanism by which (i) and (ii) could come to be true (and makes their truth much more likely). Inflation is thus a dynamical explanation of (i) and (ii). The problem is that "inflation requires as much 'fine-tuning' as it was intended to explain" (112). And explaining X by saying "X because Z" isn't much progress if Z calls out for explanation just as much as X did. So, according to SSM, inflationary cosmology can't do the work it is supposed to do. They hold that the mistake was assuming that that work needed to be done by a dynamical explanation.

Similarly, there is only a problem explaining why the universe began in a low entropy state if you think an explanation must cite an earlier state. (The problem, of course, is that there aren't any earlier states.) But if you don't require explanations of states to appeal to earlier states, if you allow for adynamical explanations, there is nothing to worry about: you can explain why the universe started in a low entropy state by citing a later state of the universe, together with the adynamical constraint laws.

Of course, if you explain the initial state of the universe by citing a later state, you probably shouldn't explain that later state by citing the initial state; it can't be both that A because B and B because A. (Explanation is "anti-symmetric.") But many physicists do want to explain non-initial states of the universe by citing the initial state. Maybe SSM think they should stop doing that. But questions remain. If physicists follow SSM's advice, can they then explain every state of the universe? That is, for each region of spacetime, can they explain why that region of spacetime is in the state it is in, without ever asserting both "A because B" and "B because A"? If this cannot be done then there is at least one region of spacetime with the property that that region's being in such-and-such a state remains unexplained. If this is how things play out, then SSM are in the same boat as those who accept only dynamical explanations: some states of the universe are unexplained. Maybe SSM think that the particular fact that they cannot explain is a better one to leave unexplained than the fact that the universe started off in a low entropy state. But why is it a better fact to leave unexplained? I'm not sure what SSM's answers to these questions are.

So much for general relativity. What about quantum mechanics? It was in SSM's discussion of quantum mechanics that this reviewer found the thread becoming quite hard to follow. The outstanding questions about quantum mechanics are familiar enough. Two key questions: does the wavefunction collapse, or not? How exactly do pairs of particles in EPR-type experiments manage to violate Bell's inequality? It is clear enough in general what SSM want to say: existing answers to these questions (like Bohmian mechanics, or GRW) are bad, and are bad because they presuppose that explanations must be dynamical; if you free your mind, and accept the possibility of adynamical explanations (which appeal to Feynman's path integral formulation of quantum mechanics), much better answers to these (and other) questions are available.

Unfortunately I could not make out what those better answers are supposed to be. I could follow SSM's descriptions of the existing answers which they reject, but then the prose would become tar-like, and I could not make out their proposed alternative. I'm not sure what to make, for example, of the claim that, on SSM's view, "the most fundamental ontological reality is not entity-based" (166). It is clear that they hold that "the fundamental entities in RBW [their view] are 4D spacetimesource elements" (169), but I'm not really sure what a spacetimesource element is. Nor am I sure how to reconcile this claim about what the fundamental entities are with their earlier claim that their ontology is not entity-based. SSM also write that

our view rejects the idea that objective reality is ultimately composed of things, that is, self-subsisting entities, individuals, or trans-temporal objects with intrinsic properties and 'primitive thisness,' haecceity, etc . . . Relations are primary while the relata are derivative, so relata are not fundamentally 'built of relata'. (188)

But I'm not really sure what that means.

This much I did understand about SSM's treatment of quantum mechanics: SSM misrepresent Bell's theorem. Here is how they put it:

Given two explicit assumptions, what Bell's theorem [Bell, 1964] shows is no assignment of (in this case) spin properties to the two particles can reproduce the measurement results we observe . . . this result is known as a no-go argument against any hidden variables interpretation of QM . . . However, both the explicit (classical) assumptions Bell made can be questioned and they are as follows: . . . Locality assumption: Measurements performed on one particle at spacelike separation from another cannot influence the state of the other particle". (144)

Bell appears here as an opponent of hidden variables interpretations and a fan of locality; it is made to look as if only certain of Bell's enlightened readers thought to question locality. Of course exactly the opposite was the case: it was Bell who was the genius who thought to question locality -- his theorem proves that locality is false -- and Bell saw a lot to like in Bohmian mechanics, a hidden variables theory. Locality is an "assumption" of Bell's proof only in the way that not-P is an assumption in a reductio ad absurdum proof that P. And his theorem isn't a theorem about hidden variables theories: his claim is that no local theory of any kind, hidden variables or not, can reproduce the observed statistics. These mistakes in understanding Bell are mistakes that shouldn't get made anymore.

Part III of the book switches gears and takes up our experience of the passage of time. This is where many opponents of the block universe theory of time plant their flag: only their theory, they say, whether it be presentism, or the moving spotlight theory, or something else, can explain why our experience of time has the features it does. The block universe theory, they say, cannot explain this.

SSM cite with approval various other philosophers' arguments that our experience would be the same, whether the block universe theory were true, or one of the alternatives were true instead; after all, even if some metaphysical process worth calling The Passage of Time were happening, our brains would be unable to detect it. (For example, they quote Callender 2012 extensively.) If this is right, SSM say, then those alternatives to the block universe theory do not have better explanations of our experience of time than the block universe theory does.

SSM are still worried, however, that the block universe theory cannot explain our experience of time, indeed that if the block universe theory is true, conscious experience is impossible. They think that many philosophical theses that proponents of the block universe theory typically accept must be rejected, if the theory is to be safe for conscious experience.

Before looking at what those theses are or what SSM put in their place we should back up and ask just what features of our experience of time are the ones that these theories are supposed to be trying to explain. SSM helpfully list them at the beginning of chapter 7 (on page 298):

  1. Presence (the experience that there is an objective present moment).
  2. Passage (the experience of ceaseless change -- a moving present).
  3. Direction (the experience that time moves in only one direction from past to future).

That's pretty much all they say about the phenomena that need explanation. But I'm not really sure what they're talking about. As for 1, I'm not sure I have ever had an "experience that there is an objective present moment." As for 2, as I now look out over my laptop I am having an "experience of ceaseless change." But it's hard to see why that is any kind of problem for the block universe theory of time. The block universe theory says that things change all the time. Presumably when you combine the theory with the right physics and theory of perception, it will say that I can perceive these changes (and so have experiences of them), provided I'm facing in the right direction and not asleep. What's the problem? Maybe SSM think there is a problem because they think that nothing changes, if the block universe theory is true. This idea appears in several places; here is page 312: "from a God's-eye perspective, nothing is moving in a block universe." But that's just not true, and is in fact a gross misunderstanding of the theory. Wearing my block universe hat, I say: to move is to be in one place at one time, and another place at another time; many things, that car in front of me for example, are in one place at one time and in another place at another time (it is currently in the parking spot in front of me, and not long ago was somewhere else); so many things move. All this is true not just from "my perspective" but from a "God's-eye perspective."

What about line 3, Direction? Do I have an "experience that time moves in only one direction"? I'm not really sure what is being asked here. This much I'm sure about: It is now 2pm, and it was, a bit ago, 1pm. So it's now later than it was. But these claims are true if the block universe theory is true; they are not any kind of problem for the theory. If there is more to having "an experience that time moves from past to future" than this banal observation, I don't know what it is.

Maybe I'm just missing the aspects of experience that SSM want a theory of time to explain. If so, it would have been nice if they had worked harder to make those aspects harder to miss. At one point SSM quote Callender (2012) writing that "philosophy of time ought to refine our description of what needs to be explained," and they immediately follow this quotation with "We agree wholeheartedly with this advice" (310). Me too. I wish they'd done a better job taking it.

So how do SSM propose to explain how consciousness is possible in a block universe? Dualism is out; we're not going to entertain the idea that minds are non-physical things. SSM also think that textbook "reductive physicalism," on which mental properties are grounded in non-mental (physical) properties, is a non-starter. They also reject "radical emergence" and "panpsychism," the idea that basic physical properties, like having negative charge, are mental properties. What's left? SSM say: neutral monism.

Neutral monists are a diverse lot. One version of neutral monism says, roughly, that both mental facts and physical facts are grounded in some third kind of "neutral" fact. I don't know, however, just what SSM's neutral monism says, because I can't make much sense of their statements of it. So I'll just give a sample:

in neutral monism not only are self/world two sides of the same coin . . . but they are co-extant, non-dual aspects of a neutral and fundamental Presence (note that this isn't the same thing as presentness). It is worth noting that Presence is neutral in three important respects. First, there are no qualia, no fundamental self, no material substances, and more generally no categorical distinction between the mental . . . and the physical . . . There is also no dualism between the qualitative and the intentional. Second, the subject/object division is a self-consistency relation; there is only one reality . . . Third, there is no ontic priority of Presence over the external world in the sense of reducibility; they are co-fundamental. (363)

One place where philosophy is supposed to have made progress over the last one hundred years is in the level of precision with which the theses under debate are formulated. We may not agree with each other any more than philosophers ever have, but at least we are better at saying what it is we disagree about. The quoted statement of neutral monism does not meet the standards of precision that contemporary philosophers should expect of each other.

Part of what drives SSM to neutral monism are some convictions about what the block universe theory of time says:

the fundamental working assumption of cognitive neuroscience and much of philosophy of mind is that matter in general and brain processes in particular are more fundamental than consciousness, both ontologically and by way of explanation. [But] from the God's-eye view in the blockworld there is no absolute/objective motion of change, no objective dynamical/causal processes actually exist . . . In a blockworld . . . any explanations proffered for any event . . . that appeal to causal mechanisms/processes, dynamical laws, or more generally "becoming," "change, "generation," etc., must be error theories or merely compatibilist/perspectival accounts of such processes, all of which implies that brain "processes" do not literally cause . . . conscious "processes". (339)

Agreed: if at the physical level nothing changes and nothing causes anything, it does seem hard to say what physical facts ground conscious experience. But SSM are tying their hands behind their back: I see no barrier in the block universe theory to accepting that there is change and that causal processes do exist.

Just before this book's title page is an entire page of praise from a long list of eminent philosophers. Huw Price calls the book "important." Jeffrey Bub calls it a "tour-de-force." They recommend the book. I'm afraid, though, that I cannot. The idea that there are adynamical explanations is an interesting one. But I was left with too many unanswered questions about how one is supposed to go about explaining everything (or everything one can explain) adynamically. Also, SSM make claims about the block universe theory, claims they use as premises in their arguments, that are, I think, clearly wrong. And large parts of the book were written in a way that made it very hard to figure out what the authors meant to assert.


Callender, Craig 2012. "Is time an illusion?" Scientific American, 302, 58-65.