Beyond the Ethical Demand (Book 1); and, Concern for the Other: Perspectives on the Ethics of K. E. Løgstrup (Book 2)

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K. E. Løgstrup, Beyond the Ethical Demand, Kees van Kooten Niekerk (intro.), University of Notre Dame Press, 2007, 173pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268034078

Svend Andersen and Kees van Kooten Niekerk (eds.), Concern for the Other: Perspectives on the Ethics of K. E. Løgstrup, University of Notre Dame Press, 2007, 225pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268020316.

Reviewed by Stephen Darwall, Yale University



Knud Ejler Løgstrup (1905-1981) was a Danish theologian who was professor of ethics and philosophy of religion at the University of Aarhus from 1943 until his retirement in 1975. Although his ethical ideas are firmly rooted in Protestant, primarily Lutheran, theology, Løgstrup’s thinking was also shaped by substantial philosophical training, most especially in the phenomenological tradition deriving from Husserl. Løgstrup’s major work, Den Etiske Fordring (1956), was published in English as The Ethical Demand in 1997 by the University of Notre Dame Press, with an introduction by Alasdair MacIntyre and Hans Fink. Beyond the Ethical Demand is a compilation of selections from Løgstrup’s later work in which he develops and to some extent revises his earlier views in important ways. Concern for the Other is an anthology of critical essays on Løgstrup by philosophers and theologians.

The University of Notre Dame Press is to be congratulated for publishing both the two books here reviewed as well as The Ethical Demand. Although the latter received some notice in English-speaking philosophical journals — it was reviewed in both Ethics and The Journal of Value Inquiry — Løgstrup’s work remains mostly unknown among Anglophone moral philosophers. It is, however, filled with significant moral psychological and ethical insights. Løgstrup is especially incisive in noting and analyzing matters of moral phenomenology, and the overall thrust of his view has great interest as well. Moreover, as the most recent volumes make clear, Løgstrup was himself engaged with mid-twentieth-century British moral philosophers like Nowell-Smith and Hare. Twenty-first-century Anglophone ethical philosophy would engage him to its profit.

I will begin by summarizing Løgstrup’s views in The Ethical Demand before proceeding to the two books published in 2007. By “the ethical demand,” Løgstrup meant a “radical” and “absolute,” but also “unfulfillable,” demand to respond to all persons with benevolent concern for their sake. I’ll come to what Løgstrup takes to be the source of this demand presently. The moral phenomenological “fact” from which he begins, however, is a natural vulnerability and susceptibility to one another that we experience in living together. The natural condition of human beings is a kind of trust. The point is not just that we perforce trust one another not to harm and to assist us, as, for example, on the highway. It is that our default attitudes toward one another make us mutually vulnerable, psychically. Our situation is one of interdependence: first, and most obviously, because we all need and cannot live without one another; but second, and more importantly, because we inhabit an intersubjective attitudinal and emotional world. Until we defend ourselves in one way or another, we naturally “lay ourselves open” and “lie in the power of [each] other’s words and deeds.” It is only because they begin from a default position of trust that children can learn language or, indeed, anything at all. And adult practices, cultures, and societies depend on natural trust also.

Owing to our basic mutual vulnerability, we experience failures to respond as a kind of rejection. And since being “delivered over to another person means that our mutual relationships are always relationships of power,” issues of respect are inevitably involved as well.

Løgstrup’s picture here shares much with writers, like Carol Gilligan and Nel Noddings, who began to speak of an “ethics of care” in the 1980s. Like Gilligan, who sometimes talks also about an “ethics of responsibility,” Løgstrup’s idea is that ethical questions invariably arise within webs of relationship in which actions are responses to others who, in one way or another, have put themselves “in our hands.” Ethical action is always therefore an expression of care: its object is whatever will benefit the other and its motivation is a concern for the other for his sake. In this sense, we all have a fundamental responsibility of care for one another.

But what does any of this have to do with demands? Ethics of care are usually put forward in opposition to ethics of duties and demands. Løgstrup himself took steps in this direction in later writings that are collected in Beyond the Ethical Demand, as I shall describe presently. But first, I want to bring out what lies behind his idea of a fundamental “ethical demand” in his earlier work. Importantly, as I have argued in The Second-Person Standpoint, Løgstrup’s idea is not that our fundamental interdependence involves a basic authority to make claims and demands of one another, despite the fact that he recognizes that “in the very act of addressing another person, we make a certain demand of him.”

What Løgstrup calls "the radical [and “one-sided”] character of the demand" is that “the other person has no right him or herself to make the demand,” nor do we have any standing to make claims of others. Moreover, what is demanded of us is that we act toward others in ways that will actually benefit them most, not that we defer to what they want and their sovereignty over their own lives. Løgstrup does warn eloquently against paternalistic “encroachment,” but only on the basis that this is often worse for the putative beneficiary, not that it violates anything she might legitimately claim or demand. Løgstrup of course recognizes legal rights of autonomy, but he evidently regards these as conventional and having no inherent moral basis. We have no fundamental sovereignty over our own lives.

The sovereignty lying behind The Ethical Demand is uniquely God’s. What makes caring unreservedly and unconditionally a demand is that it is God’s implicit demand of us in having created and given us life as a gift. No created beings have any ground for any legitimate claim, since everything we have we have been given by God. What is demanded of us is simply that we receive this gift in the same loving spirit in which it was given to us. Løgstrup’s early view is thus a somewhat uneasy amalgam of an ethics of duty and an ethics of love or care. For Løgstrup, God’s creative act is apparently a free gift of love that nonetheless somehow simultaneously involves a demand without which there would be no moral obligations at all. Of course, one may reasonably wonder how God’s demands can obligate us without some freestanding obligation of gratitude in the background or without his having authority on some basis other than his own demands.

Already in The Ethical Demand, Løgstrup expresses a kind of particularism. The demand, he says, “provides no explicit directive” or “theory,” but “forces us to start afresh in each new situation.” In “The Sovereign Expressions of Life” (included in Beyond the Ethical Demand) and in his doctrine there of “morality as a substitute,” Løgstrup goes significantly further in a direction that seems quite opposed to any ethic of duty. Whereas in the earlier work natural motives of trust and openness form the basic background that gives the ethical demand its function and content, in Løgstrup’s later writings these become sources of ethical reasons themselves that make moral demands, at best, a poor substitute and, at worst, something that can suffocate and kill the ethical life.

Løgstrup is a deep thinker with a gift for pithy formulation, so whenever he adopts a phrase, it is worth pausing to consider exactly what it is supposed to mean. All three of the nouns in “sovereign expressions of life” are significant. As I mentioned earlier, Løgstrup was already suspicious of in The Ethical Demand of the idea of any basic personal sovereignty, which, he says there, would leave us in fundamentally different “worlds.” We become part of one another’s worlds only when we care unreservedly and thereby make each other’s good part of our own. Somewhat like Marx in “On the Jewish Question,” Løgstrup takes the view that recognizing fundamental rights of autonomy alienates us from one another. In “The Sovereign Expressions of Life,” however, Løgstrup makes an even more radical departure, since his idea there is that being properly connected to one another does not involve recognizing anyone’s authority, not even God’s. Life itself is sovereign, and it expresses its sovereignty, not in any legitimate demand but in the very same creative loving promptings that lie behind God’s creative act. We live ethically, then, when we “immediately” and “spontaneously” express interconnecting life in us. Since human life invariably takes place within an interpersonal space of assumed “sincerity” and trust, we do not merely manifest these motives; we express them to one another and thereby create a shared “world” of significance and value together.

Løgstrup’s writings are filled with apt illustrative examples. He describes, for instance, a woman who is faced with two “secret police” seeking information about her husband, one evidently brutal, the other with an insinuating charm. Although the woman is aware that both will do anything they can to elicit information from her, she nonetheless “needs constantly to rein in an inclination to talk to the [second] man as to another human being … unremittingly, she must keep a cool head.” “What manifests itself in that inclination?” Løgstrup asks. “Nothing other than the elemental and definitive peculiarity attaching to all speech qua spontaneous expression of life: its openness.” Speaking openly is “not something the individual does with speech; it is there beforehand” as an “expression of life.” “Even in a situation where hoodwinking the other is a matter of life and death … it makes itself felt.”

Løgstrup’s main opponents in his later writings are Kierkegaard and Kant — Kierkegaard, because he holds that the religious life involves a turning away from the “immediacy” of human connection, and Kant, because of his doctrine that actions only have moral worth when motivated by duty. For the later Løgstrup, morality as demand is but a second-best backup or “substitute” for the “sovereign expressions of life” that connect us without mediation. In 1968 and 1972, Løgstrup is sounding themes that will be echoed later in Bernard Williams on the corrupting role of reflection and in more recent philosophers, like Nomy Arpaly, writing on “inverse akrasia.” For example, Løgstrup describes a scene in Conrad’s The Nigger of Narcissus in which it “suddenly dawns on the crew” that a despised West Indian, Jimmy Waits, is trapped and quite possibly dead when a hurricane causes the ship to list dangerously and water to flood into the cabin where he has been kept. Despite great risk to themselves, the crew’s natural humanity leads them immediately to rescue Waits with “no slippage between their thought and action.” “When,” however, “the work allows them the breathing space for moral reflection,” their attitude towards the man they have saved becomes “one of hatred towards the miserable, self-pitying malingerer.”

Concern for the Other consists of a number of interesting essays on different aspects of Løgstrup’s ideas. Among the issues discussed is whether the idea of life as a “gift,” or even, in Løgstrup’s later sense, life’s givenness, require controversial, and perhaps implausible, theological or metaphysical premises. It seems obviously insufficient for Løgstrup’s purposes to take our basic psychic vulnerability and openness as simply an empirical given. At the least, it must be seen as having some intrinsic normative relevance. And even if, as Hans Finks suggests, having an “attitude to life … of gratitude” is “appropriate,” there is still the substantial question of whether that can be fully intelligible without, as Alasdair MacIntyre suspects, Løgstrup’s original theological premise.

Many of the essays helpfully discuss Løgstrup in relation to other thinkers. Svend Andersen contrasts Løgstrup with Scheler’s “ideal consequentialism” and usefully places Løgstrup’s ideas in relation to a phenomenological tradition that includes Heidegger, Hans Lipps, and Emmanuel Lévinas. Especially interesting here is the way in which Andersen locates Løgstrup in relation to Lipps on “the look” and Lévinas on “the face.” Kees van Kooten Niekerk discusses Løgstrup’s later idea of “morality as a substitute,” and argues that it has roots in an earlier Lebensphilosophie, represented by Nietzsche, Dilthey, and Bergson, as well as lesser-known Danish theologians and religious historians, like Eduard Geismar and Vilhelm Grønbech. Niekerk also has interesting things to say about the opposition between Løgstrup and Kierkegaard. Brenda Almond draws the connection between Løgstrup and Gilligan and the “ethics of care,” but also discusses Løgstrup’s engagement with British philosophers of the period, like R. M. Hare.

Alasdair MacIntyre, to whom we are indebted for helping to introduce English-speaking readers to Løgstrup in the first place, comments on Løgstrup’s views mainly from a Thomist and Aristotelian perspective. He notes that Aristotle’s doctrine of “natural friendship that all human beings have for one another” gives him a kind of a doctrine of natural trust: “This is evident when a human being loses his or her way; for everyone stops even an unknown stranger from taking the wrong road.” But MacIntyre emphasizes that although trust may be a natural default, especially for children, mature trust must be able to survive rational criticism.

Finally, I would like to note a critical point that Niekerk makes as a way of introducing one of my own. Although in his later writings, Løgstrup came to see actions motivated by a sense of moral duty as invariably self-serving — what Niekerk calls a “‘sinful’ rapture at one’s own righteousness” — Niekerk correctly asks, “Is it not possible to do something just because we consider it morally right, without thinking of, or aiming at, our own goodness?” A natural Løgstrupian reply would be to agree with Bernard Williams that even so, a thought of moral duty would still be “one thought too many.” If we are to relate to one another in an unalienated fashion, it would seem that we have to be able to act for others for their sake, and not (just anyway) for the sake of moral duty.

There are, however, different ways in which we can act for one another’s sake, and acting out of care or benevolent concern for them is just one. If you want or ask me to do something, and I do it for that reason, then there is a sense in which I am acting for your sake even if I judge my action to be something that does not benefit or even that harms you, like lighting your cigarette. In deferring to your wishes, I grant you a kind of respect, I recognize your authority to lead your own life and regulate my relation to you by that. Making claims and demands against one another can of course alienate us, but it need not. Indeed, seeing one another as “self-originating sources of valid claims,” as Rawls put it, seems an essential aspect of mature human relationships. Reciprocity, in the sense of mutual accountability, need not involve a strategic quid pro quo as Løgstrup sometimes seems to suggest. Although it is fundamentally reciprocal or symmetrical, recognition of, or respect for, one another as equals need be no less unconditional.

In my view, Løgstrup was right to give up the idea of morality as divine demand, but not right to regard morality, including the idea that we are accountable to one another as equal persons, as but a poor substitute for fully engaged living, or to relegate it to convention. To bring ethics properly “down to earth,” we must see its fundamental authority not as deriving from God or as grounded somehow as a practical “given” in life, but as based on an authority that all persons share and that, I would argue, we are committed to presupposing through encounters with one another.