Bioethics, Public Moral Argument, and Social Responsibility

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Nancy M.P. King and Michael J. Hyde (eds.), Bioethics, Public Moral Argument, and Social Responsibility, Routledge, 2012, 179pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415898553.

Reviewed by Leonard M. Fleck, Michigan State University


"The need to consider carefully the meaning of responsible public moral argument -- and the responsibility to achieve it -- could hardly be more pressing than it is today" (xiv). This passage is from the editors' introduction. Truer words have never been written. As I begin this review, newspapers are filled with stories and opinion pieces about the question of whether contraception ought to be among the essential benefits guaranteed to all Americans under the Patient Protection and Affordable Care Act. The Catholic Church and some other religiously conservative groups have opposed such inclusion, at least in the case of health plans provided by institutions they control. The problem, of course, is that many employees of these institutions are either non-Catholics or Catholics who wish to use birth control. How should we (thoughtful bioethicists) conceptualize this issue? Defenders of the Catholic position see it as a matter of religious liberty, but their critics can just as readily characterize it as a matter of religious tyranny. This is hardly an auspicious beginning for respectful and responsible public moral argument.

The issue of contraception affects millions, but we could, for the sake of argument, put it aside. We might be tempted to regard this as an oddball issue that only garnered media attention because this is an election year. However, that would be a mistake. This sort of issue is rapidly becoming ubiquitous. To give some quick examples, should there be public funding for pre-implantation genetic diagnosis when a couple knows they are at risk for having a child with a serious genetic disorder that would very adversely affect both length of life and quality of life, such as cystic fibrosis or Duchenne's muscular dystrophy? The cost of that reproductive option is about $40,000, considerably more than what is at stake with contraception. And then there are the social costs associated with providing appropriate care for such unfortunate children.

If the field of regenerative medicine develops as many expect it will, there could be many future medical therapies for diabetes, damaged hearts, or spinal cord injuries that will require the use of embryonic stem cells. These will be very expensive and very effective interventions that are likely to elicit strong objections from various religious groups. May these interventions also be excluded justifiably from a national "essential benefits" package in order to avoid offending the consciences of those who would reject these interventions?

Finally, recent news accounts indicate we have already achieved the capacity to do a $1,000 genome test, a complete readout of the genome of any individual. This will have enormous utility in the everyday practice of medicine by permitting much more individualized use of pharmaceuticals with fewer side effects. No one expects that to trigger any religious moral objections. However, that same technology will yield at the very same time information that will be reproductively relevant for some couples and motivate them to use some alternative reproductive technology to protect the best genetic interests of their future possible children. Should the $1,000 genome test also be excluded from the national "essential benefits" package because some potential uses of that genetic information would be offensive to some religious groups?

Philosophers might be a bit disappointed by this collection of essays. Most of the contributors are from Communication departments looking at the issue of public moral argument from a rhetorical perspective as opposed to a philosophic perspective. In the opening essay, David Zarefsky sets up the basic problem quite nicely. Public moral argument occurs within a democratic society. Policy decisions need to be made. They have to be made in a context where there are conflicting perspectives regarding what values ought to shape those policy decisions. In addition, the relevant factual information (social, economic, scientific) may have various degrees of uncertainty attached to it. In particular, there might be a lot of disagreement about the likely future consequences associated with choosing one policy rather than another. But a policy needs to be adopted within a relatively limited time frame, and this will require advocates for any of the policy options persuading a majority of citizens or a majority of legislators to choose one policy rather than another.

Philosophers see the situation described above as requiring the offering of the best reasons, arguments, and evidence for one policy option rather than the other. A commitment to honesty and truthfulness is absolutely essential to the enterprise of responsible public argument. By way of contrast (as I understand rhetoric), the goal of the rhetorician is to find the words that will be most effective in presenting the most persuasive case for whatever option they might favor. This is not about being dishonest, saying things one knows to be false. Rather, it is about skillfully taking advantage of the rhetorical space made available by fuzzy facts and uncertainties regarding predicted future consequences, choosing words that will positively resonate with an audience you hope to persuade, and constructing a problem narrative that will emphasize those elements of a problem most supportive of your proposed policy resolution of that problem. These are the skills of an effective and honest courtroom lawyer before a jury.

Should philosophers eschew such rhetorical practices, whether in the classroom, the public square, or at a philosophy conference? Zarefsky mentions the civil rights struggles and the efforts to put in place policies that would protect especially the civil rights of those who had been victims of discrimination. It is difficult to imagine a philosopher presenting a Kantian argument for equal concern and respect in the public square that would have won the day for civil rights as effectively as Martin Luther King, Jr. Appeals to the Categorical Imperative elicit neither inspiration nor perspiration for any noble cause.

Much of my own work is focused on problems of health care justice related to health care cost containment, what I comfortably refer to as the problem of health care rationing (Fleck, 2009). In the political world, however, the "R" word is a deadly liability. Politicians who intend to retain their offices will never use that word, though they will forcefully argue for the need to control health care costs, especially for taxpayer-funded programs such as Medicare and Medicaid. What they will speak of is the need to get rid of wasteful and inefficient health care. Who would want to run for office as an advocate of wasteful and inefficient health services funded by taxpayers? In the real world of medicine, however, as opposed to a rhetorically-reconstructed political world, one person's medical waste and inefficiency is another person's (costly) life-sustaining medical care. What politicians are saying here seems completely dishonest.

In the past Paul Menzel, a philosopher at Pacific Lutheran University, has been an explicit advocate of the inescapability of the need for health care rationing, minimizing the use of marginally beneficial non-costworthy health care services, if we are going to have more just access for all to needed health care (Menzel 1983; 1990). He still is. However, of late he has explicitly given up the language of rationing in favor of the language of priority-setting. He is entirely honest about this. Audiences would tune him out as soon as he spoke of rationing. The word has too many negative associations for the broad public, made worse by Sarah Palin's linking it to federally-sponsored "death panels." What is an honest philosopher to do, either in the classroom or the public square?

Christine Nero Coughlin, Tracey Banks Coan, and Barbara Lentz contribute an essay titled "Bioethics and the Law: Using Moot Court as a Tool to Teach Effective Argumentation Skills." The authors point out that the primary goal of this exercise is for students to fully develop the strongest substantive arguments for the position they are defending. They wish to discourage students from coming up with merely "clever" arguments. This is more like a philosophy seminar in that the students are arguing before a panel of judges (as in an Appellate proceeding) as opposed to a panel of jurors. But in the public square arguing about bioethics issues is more like arguing to persuade a jury; intricate substantive arguments are unlikely to be persuasive. In the public square the goal is to generate support for good public policies, as opposed to the best conceivable policies. It is far from clear that "best conceivable policies" has any practical meaning at all, given the need to typically balance multiple respectable social values for any reasonable social policy. In reality, there will often be multiple policy options for any social problem that will be "just enough" or "good enough," which is why we then invoke democratic processes to legitimate some choice. Of course we do not want a mere aggregation of thoughtless democratic preferences to prevail. We want thoughtful democratic deliberation to determine outcomes. Will this be more likely to be achieved by the philosopher's philosopher or the skillful philosopher rhetorician? Which is the more "responsible" role to assume?

In her essay, Rebecca Dresser defends the role of dignity as a useful concept in bioethics, though she readily admits that "the concept is used to support opposing positions on abortion and physician-assisted suicide" (49). So how do we go about distinguishing legitimate from illegitimate uses of the concept of dignity in public bioethical argument?

Eric Juengst's essay discusses the role of appeals to human nature in biomedical ethics. Again, it does not take much effort to show how an appeal to human nature to justify or condemn any number of novel medical practices leads to opposing positions. How do we go about distinguishing legitimate from illegitimate appeals to congruence with human nature in public bioethical argument? If we easily accept computers as a perfectly legitimate enhancement of human intellectual functionings, why should we not just as readily accept various drugs for enhancing athletic functionings?

Several of the remaining essays address issues related to genetics, personal responsibility, public misconceptions about genetics, and the responsibility of the media and bioethicists to address those misconceptions. The problem, however, is that these misconceptions are not simply rooted in scientific illiteracy (correctable by better science education) but instead may be rooted in deeper worldviews, either religious (divine determinism) or broadly ideological (strong attributions of personal responsibility for one's own health). What are bioethicists supposed to do by way of "correcting" those deeper worldviews? In another essay, "Media Misinformation and the Obesity Epidemic," Stephen Giles and Marina Krcmar contend that television food advertizing is at least partially responsible for the obesity epidemic. They contend that bioethicists need to be social activists, condemn media irresponsibility in this matter, and critically respond to those who see obesity entirely as a matter of personal responsibility.

Carl Elliott's essay is easily the most provocative in the book. It is titled "An Investigative Bioethics Manifesto." The title says it all. He believes that at least some bioethicists ought to commit themselves to exposing evil behavior within the health care system, much as Henry Beecher did almost fifty years ago in calling attention to abuses in medical research. He observes that in the early days of bioethics this was a real possibility because bioethicists were outsiders to the health care system. But now they are very often insiders, dependent for status and paychecks upon the health care system, and consequently poorly motivated to be strong critics of even the most egregious misbehavior within health care. Near the conclusion of his essay Elliott quotes, perhaps with sadness, the sociologist Jonathan Imber who described bioethics as "the public relations division of modern medicine" (151). This is not a characterization that Socrates could be proud of.

The concluding essay by Christian Lundberg and Ross Smith brings us back to the central themes of public moral argument and social responsibility. They recall the work of John Dewey and call upon bioethicists to take up the work of "cultivating public capacities for deliberation and response" (158). I certainly endorse that conclusion as a worthy task for bioethicists specifically and academics generally. But this is a much more complicated task than the quoted passage would convey. Again, Lundberg and Smith write, "The question is whether or not bioethicists and communication scholars can work effectively to build the capacities for deliberation and advocacy that serve as preconditions for the success of any deliberative process" (159). As I noted earlier, philosophers will likely find themselves dissatisfied with this collection because the most fundamental challenge associated with public moral argument, what I would characterize as the analytic/ rhetorical divide, is not addressed directly enough or adequately enough. To what extent may bioethicist philosophers alter in good conscience what they say and how they say it in order to be more effective public advocates for reasonable policies that address controversial bioethical issues? This is a very complex challenge. I wish it had been addressed more forthrightly, as the title of this volume suggests.


Fleck, L. 2009. Just Caring; Health Care Rationing and Democratic Deliberation. New York: Oxford University Press.

Menzel, P. 1983. Medical Costs, Moral Choices: A Philosophy of Health Care Economics in America. New Haven: Yale University Press.

Menzel, P. 1990. Strong Medicine: The Ethical Rationing of Health Care. New York: Oxford University Press.