Blanchot and Literary Criticism

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Mark Hewson, Blanchot and Literary Criticism, Continuum, 2011, 150pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441115232.

Reviewed by Gerald Bruns, University of Notre Dame


One of the interesting features of French intellectual life during the last century is that -- in contrast to its German and Anglo-American counterparts -- its disciplinary boundaries were relatively unguarded. One effect was the appearance of an anomaly like Maurice Blanchot (1907-2003), a critical essayist, a writer of experimental fiction (among other kinds of texts), and a clandestine companion of philosophers who were themselves frequently anomalous in virtue of the density or eccentricity of their writings: Emmanuel Levinas, Michel Foucault, and Jacques Derrida (to name only these). On this side of the Atlantic Blanchot's best readers have been fiction writers like Lydia Davis, who first made Blanchot available in English as translator of the essays collected in The Gaze of Orpheus (Station Hill Press, 1981), and poets like Charlotte Mandell, translator of La Part du feu (The Work of Fire [Stanford University Press, 1995]), among many other of Blanchot's essay collections. During the past fifteen years there has been an outpouring of scholarly studies of Blanchot's work, most of them reasonably accomplished even as they remain, in the end, largely defeated by the range and complexity of a career that spanned more than sixty years.

Perhaps in recognition of this difficulty Mark Hewson pretty much ignores the research of others and concentrates his attention on a handful of essays that Blanchot wrote during the late 1940s and early 1950s -- principally those reprinted in La Part du feu (1949) and L'Espace littéraire (1955), in which, Hewson says, "Blanchot positions his studies within a philosophical-historical interpretation of modernity, derived from a free adaptation of Hegel and Heidegger, and inflected by the French reception of Hegel in writers such as Sartre, Kojève and Hyppolite" (p. xiii). The term "modernity" here possesses a double edge. On the one hand it refers to the "rationalization of the world" that Max Weber famously described and which has been the subject of various forms of critique and defense (or perhaps "rescue" would be the better term).[1] Meanwhile, there is the "modernist" tradition in art, literature, and music, where the basic idea is that, after Hegel's "end-of-art" thesis, art becomes a question for itself -- an open-ended self-questioning that cannot be terminated by means of concepts, theories, or genre-descriptions.[2] Modernism is made of anomalies like Marcel Duchamp's Readymades, Gertrude Stein's paratactic writings, and the formidable monument of James Joyce's Finnegans Wake. In the face of the modernist artwork, universals have to give way to ground-level descriptions of particulars against the background of historical and cultural contexts -- what used to be called philology, or literary criticism. For his part, Blanchot is rather more a theorist interested in philosophical contexts and the disturbances that literary modernism creates when placed inside them.

As Hewson observes in his first chapter, "The Modern Age and the 'Work' of Literature," Blanchot was among the first to develop the anarchic notion of the modernist work as something singular and refractory to any rule or principle of identity. In an essay on "The Disappearance of Literature" (1959), Blanchot writes:

the essence of literature is precisely to escape any essential determination, any assertion that stabilizes it or even realizes it: it is never already there, it always has to be rediscovered or reinvented. It is not even certain that the word literature or the word art corresponds to anything real, anything possible or anything important.[3]

In place of "literature" Blanchot prefers the neutral term écriture -- writing -- which is less a productive activity than an experience in which the writing subject encounters the limits of possibility. In his introduction to his first collection of essays, Faux pas (Paris: Gallimard, 1943), Blanchot writes:

The writer finds himself in the increasingly ludicrous condition of having nothing to write, of having no means with which to write, and of being constrained by the utter necessity of always writing it. Having nothing to express must be taken in the most literal way. Whatever he would like to say, it is nothing. The world, things, knowledge are to him only landmarks across the void.[4]

Imagine the Kantian subject turned inside-out, passive before the claims of reason; or Hegel's Spirit, marooned in an entretemps in which the past recedes into a time that never was and the future fails to arrive.

Hewson pursues this issue in his second chapter, "Poetic Solitude: Two Essays on Hӧlderlin," where he takes up Blanchot's essay on "The Sacred Speech of Hӧlderlin" (1946). In this text Blanchot reads Hӧlderlin against the background of Heidegger's "Hӧlderlin and the Essence of Poetry" (1936), where poetry is said to be the condition of the world's possibility, yet paradoxically (at least on Blanchot's reading) poetry remains on the hither side of the time and history that it opens up, moving in a temporality that is not open to the future, much less to completion.[5] In spatial terms, the poet remains in a condition of radical exteriority -- an outside which is not a place that one occupies but a surface across which one moves according to an interminable nomadic itinerary. Indeed, Blanchot figures the "Sacred" in Hӧlderlin by way of Georges Bataille's concept of theheterogeneous -- the space of the outcast or exile: "The poem is exile," Blanchot writes in L'Espace littéraire,

and the poet who belongs to it belongs to the dissatisfaction of exile. He is always lost to himself, outside, far from home; he belongs to the foreign, to the outside which knows no intimacy or limit, and to the separation which Hӧlderlin names when in his madness he sees rhythm's infinite space.[6]

Thinking this way, Blanchot may seem less a modernist than one of the "last romantics" for whom poetry (or writing) is less a work than an existential crisis that the poet undergoes. Appropriating a term from Georges Bataille, Blanchot characterizes writing as a "limit-experience" like waiting, affliction, insomnia, or dying -- an experience that he figures paradoxically (or perhaps quixotically) as a liberation from "the first to the third person," and from a "throttled" world to a "world of freedom" (The Space of Literature, p. 73). Indeed, the essays in L'Espace littéraire seem regulated by this romantic preoccupation, as in "Literature and the Original Experience," where "Art is the subjective passion that no longer wants any part of the world," that is, the rationalized world in which

subordination reigns: subordination to ends, to measured proportion, to seriousness and order. On one front science, technology, the state; on another, significance, stable values, the ideal of the Good and the True. Art is 'the world turned upside down': insubordination, disproportion, frivolity, ignorance, evil, non-sense (The Space of Literature, p. 216).

Just so, insubordination is the form that Blanchot's modernism takes. In an early essay on the poet "René Char" (1946), Blanchot writes: "One must understand that poetry refuses to accept all the forces of submission and immobility, that it cannot content itself with sleep whose ease is dangerous, that it seeks surreality insofar as the domain is itsirreconciliability" (The Work of Fire, p. 102). As Hewson suggests in his chapter on "Mallarmé and Modern Poetics," poetry's insubordination is manifested in itsmaterialization of language, its refusal of any instrumental form of mediation on behalf of something outside itself. In "Mallarmé's Experience," Blanchot paraphrases Mallarmé's poetics as follows:

In poetry we are no longer referred back to the world, neither to the world as shelter nor to the world as goals. . . . The poetic word is no longer someone's word. In it no one speaks, and what speaks is not anyone. It seems rather that the word alone declares itself. . . . This means primarily that words, having initiative, are not obliged to designate anything or give voice to anyone, but that they have their ends in themselves. From here on, it is not Mallarmé who speaks, but language which speaks itself: language as the work and the work as language (The Space of Literature, p. 41).

The essays in La Part du feu develop this autotelic conception of poetic language (or, more accurately, écriture) in a way that is foundational for many of Blanchot's later writings. In his chapter on "The Ambiguity of the Negative," Hewson cites Blanchot's "Literature and the Right to Death" (1948) as the essay in which Blanchot's thinking takes its most crucial philosophical turn, principally by developing a critique of Hegel's dialectic as a movement of negation that annihilates the singularity of things by subsuming them into concepts -- a critique that doubles as a defense of poetry against Jean-Paul Sartre's attack in "What is Literature?" (1947), where poetry is dismissed as ineffectual for the way it treats words as mere things instead of taking them up as prosthetic instruments for grasping the world and making something of it (the task of prose).[7]Here is Blanchot's version of Hegel (with Kojève's fingerprints):

Hӧlderlin, Mallarmé and in general all those whose poetry has the essence of poetry as its theme, have seen a disquieting marvel in the act of naming. The word gives me what it signifies, but first it suppresses it. In order that I can say, this woman, it is necessary in one way or another that I deprive her of her reality of flesh and bone, make her absent, annihilate her. The word gives me the being, but it gives it to me deprived of being, its nothingness, that which remains of it when it has lost its being: the pure fact that it is not. From this point of view, language is a strange right. In a text anterior to the Phenomenology, Hegel, close here to his friend Hӧlderlin, wrote that: "the first act, by which Adam made himself master of the animals, was to impose a name on them; that is, he annihilated them in their existence (as existents)." By this Hegel means from this instant, the cat ceases to be a cat which is only real, and becomes an idea as well (The Work of Fire, pp. 322-23).

Hewson links up this passage with Heidegger's distinction between "ontic truth," which is propositional in character, and "ontological truth," which "is given first in pre-predicative experience," which for Hewson means "volitional and affective existence" (p. 72).[8] For Blanchot, however, this truth is the task of poetic language, whose materiality interrupts the dialectic of negation and idealization and preserves "the cat as it exists" by refusing all forms of semantic operation:

A name ceases to be the ephemeral passing of nonexistence and becomes a concrete ball, a solid mass of existence; language, abandoning the sense, the meaning which was all it wanted to be, tries to become senseless. Everything physical takes precedence: rhythm, weight, mass, shape, and then the paper on which one writes, the trail of the ink, the book (The Work of Fire, p. 327).

So modernism, as poetics of intransitive writing, is a break with, or freedom from, the "juggernaut" of modernity.[9]

In his final chapter, "Myth and Representation in Blanchot's Literary Criticism," Hewson engages the question of what counts as a "work" in Blanchot's poetics, and he rightly observes that it is an event that has nothing to do with "the 'work' that is given to us by the library and the museum" (p. 108). But what kind of event is it? Recall that the temporality of écriture is "interminable, incessant" (The Space of Literature, p. 37). Hewson does not discuss Blanchot's concept of désœuvrement (worklessness, uneventfulness) or his theory (and practice) of fragmentary writing, but he points the way when he devotes some pages to the experience of writing as "infinite labour" (p. 128), in which the writer encounters the impossibility of the work in the "inability to finish" (p. 130). The time of writing is not dialectical, with disparate elements gathered into a totality; it is rather like Gilles Deleuze's Aion, which is an event that breaks up chronology into dimensions that move apart from one another rather than together into any sort of unity, totality, or resolution.[10] Thus Blanchot, in a late text that Hewson does not take up, L'Ecriture du désastre (1980):

Fragments are written as unfinished separations. Their incompletion, their insufficiency, the disappointment at work in them, is their aimless drift, the indication that, neither unifiable nor consistent, they accommodate a certain array of marks -- the marks with which thought (in declining and declining itself) represents the furtive groupings that fictively open and close the absence of totality.[11]

In his conclusion Hewson remarks that Blanchot "seems to take modern literature more seriously and to see it more positively than literary criticism does at the present time" (p. 141). This statement certainly captures something when one considers the emphasis on "cultural studies" in recent academic scholarship, which has largely abandoned the close reading of literary texts in pursuit of sociological interests (ethnicity, ecology, gender studies, and so on). But Blanchot's conception of literary modernism is clearly coherent with the large body of criticism devoted to modern and contemporary European and American poetry, with its long history of experiments in the "verbivocovisual" dimensions of poetic language. (Interested readers should visit, with its vast archive of sound poetry, visual poetry, conceptual poetry, and the rich critical commentary that surrounds this material.)[12] Blanchot himself, as a final word, might counsel criticism to break new ground by studying the history of the fragment, beginning with the German romantics and including (besides himself) Gertrude Stein, Wittgenstein -- and Paul Celan, with his famous seven-wheeled poem:


Ein Vau, pf, in der That,

schlägt, mps,

ein Sieben-Rad:





[1] See, for example, Max Horkheimer and Theodor W. Adorno, The Dialectic of Enlightenment, trans. Edmund Jephcott (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2002), esp. pp. 1-34 ("The Concept of Enlightenment"); and, by contrast, Jürgen Habermas, The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity, trans. Frederick G. Lawrence (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1990), esp. pp. 106-30 ("The Entwinement of Myth and Enlightenment: Max Horkheimer and Theodor Adorno"). See Philosophical interventions in the Unfinished Project of Enlightenment, ed. Axel Honneth, et al. (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1992). Among the best books on the subject remains The Consequences of Modernity by the social theorist Anthony Giddens (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1990), esp. pp. 137-44 ("A Phenomenology of Modernity").

[2] See Arthur Danto, "The End of Art," The Philosophical Disenfranchisement of Art (New York: Columbia University Press, 1986), pp. 81-115, esp. 110: "the whole point of art in our century was to pursue the question of its own identity while rejecting all available answers as insufficiently general." Compare Adorno's Aesthetic Theory, trans. Robert Hullot-Kantor (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1997), p. 121: "If a work opens itself completely, it reveals itself as a question and demands reflection; then the work vanishes into the distance, only to return to those who thought they understood it, overwhelming them for the second time with the question, 'What is it?'" By contrast, see Habermas's critique of modernism, or what he calls "aesthetic modernity," in "Modernity: An Incomplete Project?," trans. Seyla Ben-Habib, Interpretive Social Science: A Second Look, ed. Paul Rabinow and William P. Sullivan (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1987), pp. 141-56. Modernism is "the experience of rebelling against all that is normative" (p. 144), and is "altogether incompatible with the moral basis of a purposive, rational conduct of life" (p. 145).

[3] The Book to Come, trans. Charlotte Mandell (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2003), p. 121.

[4] Faux Pas, trans. Charlotte Mandell (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997), p. 3. Compare Samuel Beckett, who, in a dialogue with his friend Georges Duthuit, complained about painters who "never stirred from the field of the possible, however much they enlarged it. The only thing disturbed by the revolutionaries Tal Coat and Matisse is a certain order on the plane of the feasible."

Duthuit: What other plane can there be for the maker?

Beckett: Logically, none. Yet I speak of an art turning from it in disgust, weary of its puny exploits, weary of pretending to be able, of being able, of doing a little better the same old thing, of going a little further along a dreary road.

Duthuit: And preferring what?

Beckett: The expression that there is nothing to express, nothing with which to express, no desire to express, together with the obligation to express. (Transition, no. 5 [1949], 98)

[5] Recall the distinction (or "rift") between earth and world in Heidegger's "Der Ursprung des Kunstwerkes" (1935-36): The work of art "holds open the Open of the world," but the work itself is made of earth, an impenetrable materiality that forms the unsurpassable horizon of the world. See "The Origin of the Work of Art," Poetry, Language, Thought, trans. Albert Hofstadter (New York: Harper & Row, 1971), esp. pp. 44-50.

[6] "Literature and the Original Experience," The Space of Literature, trans. Ann Smock (Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press, 1982), p. 237. See also, in this same volume, "Hӧlderlin's Itinerary," pp. 269-76.

[7] "What is Literature?" and Other Essays, ed. Steven Ungar (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988), p. 35.

[8] Recall Heidegger's "The Origin of the Work of Art," with its description of the violence that propositional thinking perpetrates upon mere things, whose thingliness is preserved by the work of the work of art, which transforms "our accustomed ties to the world" and restrains "all usual doing and prizing, knowing and looking" (Poetry, Language, Thought, p. 66).

[9] See Anthony Giddens, The Consequences of Modernity, pp. 138-39. Whereas Weber imagined modernity as a "'steel-hard' cage of bureaucratic rationality," and Marx portrayed it as a "monster," Gidden's proposes "the juggernaut -- a runaway engine of enormous power which, collectively as human beings, we can drive to some extent but which also threatens to rush out of our control and which could rend itself asunder."

[10] The Logic of Sense, trans. Mark Lester (New York: Columbia University Press, 1990), p. 63: "The Aion endlessly divides the event and pushes away past as well as future, without ever rendering them less urgent. The event is that no one ever dies, but has always just died or is always going to die, in the empty present of the Aion, that is, in eternity."

[11] The Writing of the Disaster, trans. Ann Smock (Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press, 1986), p. 58.

[12] See also Johanna Drucker, Figuring the Word: Essays on Books, Writing, and Visual Poetics (New York: Granary Books, 1998), and Marjorie Perloff's studies of modern and contemporary poetry and poetics, especially Wittgenstein's Ladder: Poetic Language and the Strangeness of the Ordinary (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996) and 21st-Century Modernism: The "New" Poetics (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2002).

[13] Gesammelte Werke, III, ed. Beda Allemann and Stefan Reichert (Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Verlag, 1986), p. 136.