Body, Mind and Self in Hume's Critical Realism

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Fred Wilson, Body, Mind and Self in Hume's Critical Realism, Ontos, 2008, 539pp., $214.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793794.

Reviewed by Wade Robison, Rochester Institute of Technology


This volume is the second in a series of three and develops themes that Wilson says he discusses in the other two volumes. The first volume, Hume's Defense of Causal Inference, appeared in 1997. The second, The External World and Our Knowledge of It: Hume's Critical Realism: An Exposition and Defense, scheduled for publication this month, will provide "a more detailed defense" of the claims of the volume reviewed here. So one should read Body, Mind and Self in Hume's Critical Realism, and this review of it, with that cautionary note in mind.

The professed aim of Wilson’s book is to show that Hume's answer to the question, "What is a person?", is essentially correct. Hume denies that the self is a substance and asserts that it is a "bundle or collection of different perceptions" (Treatise,, the Norton edition, the last number indicating the paragraph). We can put to one side the denial. It is indisputable that Hume denies that the self is a substance, and though we might disagree about Hume's reasons, perhaps Wilson's forthcoming volume will provide us with more detail.

In this volume, Wilson argues that Hume's answer to the question of personal identity has been misunderstood through "a failure to read Hume's Treatise carefully" and the use of "premises deriving from the substance tradition," despite Hume's "devastating critique of that tradition" (Wilson, p. 1). In the long last chapter, Wilson argues the following in support of his reading of Hume:

1. The "idea or impression of oneself is present in our consciousness; 'ourself is always intimately present to us' (T, p. 320; italics added. In other words, our conscious states each contain this idea or impression of oneself)" (p. 378).

2. Because "a simple act can represent … a complex bundle of events, including other awarenesses, we can treat the awareness by virtue of which various entities are among the contents of our conscious state itself as a simple mental act" (p. 381).

3. So "the Humean will argue that this awareness is a fact among the facts, a part among the parts, in the 'bundle' that makes the self" (p. 381).

4. The unity of this bundle is provided by each conscious state that makes up the bundle having "among its contents an awareness from inside of a particular body" (p. 388; see also esp. 391) because of "the special way in which conscious states belong to a body" (p. 389). "Hume does recognize," Wilson adds, "that there is no self apart from the body, as when he tells us about 'the qualities of our mind and body, that is, self' (T, p. 303)" (p. 393).

5. The identity of this bundle is provided by its having "a certain nature," namely, "the person's [enduring] character" (p. 403) or, that is, "an ordered bundle" (p. 495) of "patterns of thought and action" (p. 431) which are "created in and by the sensible world" (p. 432) so that a person is a social construct.

6. Thus, "the identity of the self is the complex relational structure that binds the parts of the bundle into a united whole," with "causality in particular [constituting] that structure" (p. 472).

We are what we are because each conscious state contains an "idea or impression of oneself" that is unique because of "the special way" each is inside a particular body, the whole set tied together through causality into a pattern that constitutes our character. This is Wilson's "central proposition about persons," namely, "A person is an individual that has a certain character" (p. 1).

Each premise in this argument is contentious, and the whole makes for a thoroughly unsatisfactory view of Hume. It is difficult to know what Wilson would say about the personal identity of Siamese twins or about split personalities, for instance, but we shall focus on what he says about Hume.

The claim in 1) that "our conscious states each contain this idea or impression of oneself" seems to run counter to Hume's claim that "So far from there being any distinct impression, attending every impression and every idea, that I do not think there are any two distinct impressions, which are inseparably conjoin'd" (Treatise, Norton edition, I.2.6.3). 1) seems to claim that every conscious state -- in Hume's term, every perception -- contains an additional impression or idea that is an impression or idea of oneself. That Hume denies, but even if it were contingently true, we must ask, "What is the impression or idea of?" "A self, obviously!", Wilson should say, and that means that the impression or idea is of the bundle of perceptions, there being "absolutely no contradiction," as he puts it, "in saying that there are two mental acts and that the one act is the object of the other" (p. 379).

The usual response to this reading of Hume is that we end up with just one more impression or idea within the bundle, with nothing to tie together the bundle. Wilson seems to claim that what ties the bundle together is the content of the perceptions always being from within a particular body and causality. We shall consider only causality here.

This is a long book, but its length is not a function of arguments given in support of contentious premises. Consider causality. Wilson begins his analysis of Hume's views by quoting the passage where Hume considers a person as a "kind of theatre." When Hume gives his considered view at the end of the section "Of personal identity," he compares a person to a "republic or commonwealth," argues that "identity is nothing really belonging to these different perceptions, and uniting them together," and claims that "the true idea of the human mind, is to consider it as a system of different perceptions or different existences, which are link'd together by the relation of cause and effect" (Treatise, Norton edition, So far, so good, Wilson might think, but Hume has introduced this "relation of cause and effect" with a careful distinction between philosophical and natural relations and with an argument that only the natural relations can serve as links to create identity.

There is not a hint of this distinction in Wilson's discussion of "Hume's Positive Account of the Self," and the only reference in the book to the distinction between philosophical and natural relations occurs on pp. 134ff. where he says, "In this account of relations there are objective and subjective components" with "the subjective component [entering] when the relation is taken naturally" (p. 135). Unfortunately, it does not get any better than that. Perhaps there is more in his volume on causation but, while that might be, nothing helpful has found its way into this volume.

Hume, however, gives a very careful causal explanation of how the natural causal relation arises. Indeed, he structures Part 3 around that causal explanation -- showing how our perception of contiguous and successive objects suffices to produce the natural relation of causation only if supplemented with perceptions of similar objects constantly conjoined. And in his confession in the Appendix that he finds himself "involv'd in … a labyrinth" regarding "the principles, that unite our successive perceptions in our thought or consciousness," he also carefully distinguishes philosophical from natural relations and makes it clear that it is the natural relations, those principles that unite, that he needs to explain.

A Humean account of the self thus requires: a recognition that it is the natural, not the philosophical, relation that is to unite our successive perceptions; a careful explication of how that relation itself relates to the corresponding philosophical relation (one that accounts for the causal relation between them, among other things); and a careful textual analysis of that portion of the Appendix where Hume confesses himself "involv'd in a labyrinth." One finds nothing in Wilson's account that is helpful when addressing these issues. Indeed, he simply refers to causality without more ado, as though the word alone suffices for an explanation.

Wilson's style of writing precludes providing careful analysis and explication of the text and precludes as well the reader's knowing that he has provided a thorough examination of what is at issue. He writes by making a claim and then considering what this philosopher objected to and what that philosopher claimed until he suddenly is on to something else. It is for the reader to look back at the claim and figure out what are the most plausible problems with it and then to determine whether they have been or can be solved. We nowhere get anything of the form, "This is my claim and my argument for it, and here are the possible problems with it: this or that word may be thought ambiguous, Hume may be thought not to commit himself to one of the crucial premises, etc."

In addition to this problem, the reader faces another. Wilson is given to making excursions into discussions that seem to bear little relation to the topic. In the chapter on Hume's account of the self, for instance, we find discussions of medical ethics, of the nature of language, of Pascal, and of Nietzsche, among other things. Some of these are interesting little essays even if too slight to be of much interest to someone professionally concerned with the topic. Others are thoroughly uninteresting. Few seem in any way necessary to the topic of the chapter.

Besides being written in a style ill-suited for clarity about his claims and arguments, the volume is also marred by some awkward sentences, by numerous misprints (e.g. "devil" for "civil" in "in devil society" at p. 378) and by grammatical lapses (e.g. a missed comma in the first sentence of the last paragraph on p. 459). The book is well-printed, tightly bound, and in need of an editor to avoid such problems -- as well as having the text hyphenated up until p. 191 and not beyond. Given Wilson's penchant for excursions, it would also be helpful to have a subject index.