(Book 1) Ernst Cassirer: The Last Philosopher of Culture; (Book 2) The Symbolic Construction of Reality: The Legacy of Ernst Cassirer

Placeholder book cover

Edward Skidelsky, Ernst Cassirer: The Last Philosopher of Culture, Princeton UP, 2008, 304pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691131344.

Jeffrey Andrew Barash (ed.), The Symbolic Construction of Reality: The Legacy of Ernst Cassirer, University of Chicago Press, 2008, 223pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226036861.

Reviewed by Peter E. Gordon, Harvard University



The rebirth of interest in the philosophical legacy of Ernst Cassirer (1874-1945) has taken many scholars by surprise. Cassirer suffered the great misfortune to emerge as a stalwart champion of humanism and Enlightenment rationality at the very moment such ideals were falling into eclipse, not only in Germany but arguably across Western Europe as well. His three-volume systematic treatise, The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, was published in successive parts during the 1920s and completed in 1929, the final year of democratic crisis. In the same year he engaged in his famous exchange with Martin Heidegger at Davos, Switzerland, a confrontation that for many participants appeared to signal (in the words of Emmanuel Lévinas, then studying at Freiburg) “the creation and the end of the world.” By 1933 Cassirer had resigned from his professorship at Hamburg and together with his wife Toni fled into exile. Heidegger, meanwhile, joined the Nazi party and assumed the Freiburg rectorship. For the next decade, Cassirer and his wife led a precarious existence. They moved from Vienna to Oxford to Uppsala, Sweden, and finally made the transatlantic crossing to the United States, where Cassirer taught (mostly at Yale) until his death in 1945. He had only a handful of disciples in Germany and even fewer in the English-speaking world. The 1942 manifesto by Susanne Langer, Philosophy in a New Key, is perhaps the earliest specimen of Cassirer’s influence in the United States. Many years later, Nelson Goodman would name Cassirer as a major inspiration for his 1978 Ways of Worldmaking, portions of which Goodman first delivered at the University of Hamburg for the centennial of Cassirer’s birth. But Cassirer was never a philosopher to arouse great enthusiasm. Even in his own day respectful colleagues such as Karl Jaspers were likely to confide to peers that “Cassirer bores me.” Some of Cassirer’s most successful students, such as the political philosopher Leo Strauss or the theorist of metaphor and modernity Hans Blumenberg, utterly revised much of what Cassirer hoped to achieve. Rudolf Carnap (who was also in the audience during the disputation at Davos) characterized Cassirer as “rather pastoral.” Isaiah Berlin judged him “serenely innocent,” and Adorno (never one to mince words) called him “totally gaga” (Skidelsky, 125). As Edward Skidelsky observes in the introductory remarks to his new study of the philosopher’s career, Cassirer’s “thought remains, when all is said and done, a stranger to our age” (7).

How then to explain the renaissance of Cassirer-scholarship in Germany and North America? Skidelsky suggests the reasons are more political than philosophical: Communism’s fall and liberalism’s apparent resurgence in Europe as in the United States have encouraged a commemorative return to icons of an earlier liberal era. A German Jew and an unwavering supporter of Weimar democracy, Cassirer now seems an obvious candidate for those seeking heroes untainted by fascism. His philosophy expressed values of rationalism and tolerance that were seemingly antithetical to some of the more fashionable trends of the 1920s: life-philosophy, Marxism, existentialism. Skidelsky calls him Heidegger’s “enemy,” though this overstates the case: Cassirer was a moderate in all things and he always sought philosophical common ground even in the midst of disagreement. Indeed, it is most of all his equanimity and his immunity to the darker currents of European intellectual history that may best explain his appeal, especially for German intellectuals such as Jürgen Habermas, whose democratic rationalism and synthetic manner of philosophical argument makes him something like Cassirer’s spiritual stepson. There are even longer lines of affiliation that bind Cassirer to the great tradition of moderate liberal thought in Central Europe — which stretches from Lessing and Kant in the eighteenth century to Friedrich Schiller and Wilhelm von Humboldt in the nineteenth century — a tradition whose many delicate strands Cassirer wove together in his own philosophical investigations of language, myth, science, and art. Scholars often note with some chagrin that Cassirer did not write an ethics, as if this were in itself a lapse or a sign of philosophical irrelevance. Others have acknowledged that his belated attempt to address the origins of fascism, The Myth of the State, written in exile and published shortly after his death, betrays the limits of a philosophy that remained too ardent in its love of ideas and inattentive to the role that brute force can play in political affairs. Skidelsky warns us against condemning Cassirer for his “apoliticism.” It is nonetheless a major theme of Skidelsky’s book that, because Cassirer’s philosophy cannot furnish the foundations for our own political needs, this renders Cassirer’s entire work more or less obsolete, notwithstanding any admiration we may feel for his achievements and no matter how much we may look upon his philosophy as (in Skidelsky’s words) a “humane and happy dream” (237).

Skidelsky is a graceful writer. He manages to convey a great many of Cassirer’s more challenging ideas with a smooth and accessible style that will no doubt prove attractive to readers who might not otherwise tolerate the often-arid character of Cassirer’s own prose. It is important to note that this book is not a true biography. It includes virtually no details concerning Cassirer’s personal life (about which one might consult the postwar memoir by his wife Toni: Mein Leben mit Ernst Cassirer), and we gain only an impressionistic image of the German Jewish educated middle-class or Bildungsbürgertum from which he sprang. His relations with his cousins the publisher Bruno Cassirer and the art-dealer Paul Cassirer are passed over quickly and without comment though both connections might have told us something more about the philosopher’s own habits of erudition and his aesthetic temperament. We do learn occasional details concerning the young Cassirer’s encounters with the pervasive anti-Semitism of the German philosophical establishment. But most of the biographical information in the book is merely anecdotal and is designed only as leavening for the philosophical portrait. A richer source for factual information is the recent German-language biography by Thomas Meyer, Ernst Cassirer (Hamburg: Ellert und Richter, 2006) to which Skidelsky occasionally refers.

I will return to Skidelsky momentarily. First let me offer a few words concerning the collection of essays edited by Jeffrey Andrew Barash, The Symbolic Construction of Reality: The Legacy of Ernst Cassirer. Originally a set of papers presented by an international group of scholars in Israel a decade ago, the volume comprises eleven essays in all, varying in subject, method, and quality. Some of them are rather too laudatory (at least for my taste), especially the essays that seek to defend Cassirer as a protagonist in a dramatic struggle for the Enlightenment or as a latter-day saint in a centuries-old Jewish tradition of critical reasoning. Other essays are truly insightful and they demonstrate how much in Cassirer’s legacy still merits exploration today. Joseph Mali assesses Cassirer’s approach to political myth and casts it in an interesting comparative light alongside other theorists of myth and collective or nationalist belief, ultimately concluding that Cassirer was too stringent a rationalist in his sensibility and therefore failed to appreciate how strongly all collectivities cleave to their myths. Fabien Capeillères provides a searching look at the role of historical reasoning in Cassirer’s philosophical system and shows how The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms is structured as a “practical teleology” that recollects the human past for the sake of present freedom. Barash’s own essay is a nuanced and critical exposition of Cassirer’s theory of myth in light of the debate with Heidegger and it is surely amongst the best summaries of this issue ever written in English or in German. Michael Roubach approaches the Cassirer-Heidegger debate from a different and less familiar angle, concentrating on the status of mathematics in Cassirer’s philosophy in order to explain the philosophers’ larger disagreement over the meanings of finitude and infinity. Youssel Schwarz devotes his essay to an informative and critical examination of the importance of Nicholas of Cusa for Cassirer’s philosophy. Donald Phillip Verene asks an intriguing question: Does Cassirer have a metaphysics, and if so, what sort of metaphysics is it? The question is a very good one especially when we consider how much Cassirer wished to displace an older substantialistic metaphysics in favor of a purely functionalist mode of explanation. Overall this is a stimulating volume and a significant contribution to the Cassirer renaissance.

Skidelsky’s book, Ernst Cassirer, is quite different and somewhat unusual in that it is structured as a kind of intellectual itinerary. Each of its chapters places Cassirer into dialogue with the various philosophical movements of his time, guiding the reader through capable and crisply explained lessons concerning the schools of thought that most inspired Cassirer and served as foils to his own development. There are helpful chapters on Marburg neo-Kantianism, Mach and Russell, the rediscovery of Goethe, logical positivism, life-philosophy, and existentialism. Midway through the book Skidelsky pauses from this itinerary to provide a helpful introductory portrait of Cassirer’s magnum opus, The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms. This chapter is only twenty-seven pages and far too brief to allow space for searching criticism, but it makes a serviceable introduction for readers who are not otherwise familiar with Cassirer’s achievements.1 All of the chapters when laid end to end bring the reader on a kind of train-ride past the major landmarks of European intellectual history. It is surely the best one-volume intellectual portrait of Cassirer one could hope to read in the English language.

Nevertheless, perhaps inevitably, some of Skidelsky’s broader generalizations leave room for disagreement. A key question that preoccupies any reader of Cassirer’s philosophy of symbolic forms is to what extent it allows for the autonomy of each symbolic realm. The question is straightforward: Cassirer had been trained as a neo-Kantian philosopher of science and his earliest works, Substance and Function, Einstein’s Theory of Relativity, and The Problem of Knowledge, are written from a more or less unqualified conviction that the highest task for philosophy is to secure the epistemological legitimacy of the modern mathmatical-physical sciences. Skidelsky rightly observes that in his earlier work Cassirer “views the lower levels of objectivization as mere preliminaries to mathematic natural science.” In Substance and Function Cassirer writes that “There is an unbroken development from the first stages of objectivication to its completed scientific form.”2 By the early 1920s, however, Cassirer had announced his intention to broaden the scope of the neo-Kantian project by effecting a turn “from the critique of knowledge to the critique of culture.” Now if mathematical-natural science had previously stood for Cassirer as the highest paradigm of legitimate knowledge, his new interest in cultural philosophy raised the perplexing issue of whether there could still be any one standard for knowledge or whether the singular paradigm of scientific objectivity would now need to yield to a plurality of equally legitimate symbolic orders.

The answer to this question is not obvious. It is of course true that in the 1920s Cassirer become a “philosopher of culture” as announced in the title of Skidelsky’s book. Much of this transformation was no doubt nourished by Cassirer’s new friendship with Aby Warburg, the rebellious son of a German-Jewish banking magnate who created a massive library in Hamburg that he hoped would become a center for the rebirth of anthropological and art-historical study. When Cassirer finally secured a permanent post as Professor of Philosophy at the newly-founded University of Hamburg in 1919 he found himself drawn into the curious circle of Warburg’s associates, amongst whom was the still-young art historian Erwin Panofsky, who benefited in turn from Cassirer’s philosophical training and authored one of the Warburg Institute’s first official lectures, “Perspective as Symbolic Form.” All of this accumulated evidence of exotic arts and mythology from around the world fired Cassirer’s imagination and gave him the courage to take a more generous view of mythical and other “non-rational” phenomena as possessing their own organizational forms and spatio-temporal principles. The project was still an essentially Kantian inquiry into transcendental rules for the ordering of experience, but the very idea of a symbolic form introduced greater flexibility. As Skidelsky explains, a Kantian category has a “fixed intellectual structure” that derives ultimately from the logical table of judgments, whereas a symbol is “open-ended”; it is unconstrained by the rules that animate mathematics and natural science (66).

This raised the puzzling matter of how such mythological rules or symbolic forms were to be compared to science. Scholars who are bent upon refashioning Cassirer into a champion for cultural diversity often emphasize his admission that even mythical systems are anchored in “an original spiritual process” that is essentially the same for all human beings: underlying all cultural forms is the very same phenomenon of spontaneity, except that this spontaneity yields different symbolic forms across different historical and cultural contexts. As Skidelsky explains, Cassirer’s philosophy is in this sense based upon a simple gesture: a historicization of Kant’s transcendental subject (125). But it is clear that Cassirer did not mean to surrender entirely his rationalist conviction that modern science was in some way superior to myth. In the third volume to The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, entitled The Phenomenology of Knowledge, Cassirer even seems to endorse the Hegelian notion of a phenomenology as a teleological system that moves from primitive to more sophisticated forms of expression and experience. Strictly speaking Skidelsky is right to observe that Cassirer does not go quite as far as Hegel, since there is for Cassirer no Aufhebung or sublation of the lower into the higher. Skidelsky writes that “Each symbolic form has its own specific content, incommensurable with that of the other” (107). This, however, is either poorly phrased or it is a step too far: despite all of his generosity toward mythical forms of expression, Cassirer is nonetheless firmly convinced that myth is an inferior mode of symbolization, and his entire inquiry presupposes that the lower mode prepares the way for and will eventually yield to a symbolic order that allows for increased self-consciousness. Cassirer believes, for example, that prophetic religion is superior to pagan mythology in part because only prophetic religion allows for individuals to conceive of themselves as agents apart from the collective, an argument upon which Skidelsky remarks. But then in what sense does Cassirer consign us to a panoply of “incommensurable” forms? One stratum is indeed compared to the other, and while their contents may well be different they are nonetheless ranked according to a common measure. Cassirer seems in this respect a thoroughgoing modernist, whose philosophy bespeaks a firm commitment to the ideal that we should progress, and in fact historically have progressed, toward higher forms of freedom and self-consciousness. Indeed, when Cassirer moves on to his discussion of science he does not hesitate to call it “the highest and most characteristic attainment of human culture.”3

Skidelsky suggests that for Cassirer this progressivist narrative was merely an assumption without foundation in logical argument. One reason Cassirer felt little need to compose an ethical philosophy was that for him ethics was simply folded into the cultural narrative: the history of progress in our symbolic capacities was qua progress already a story of our ethical advancement. This, however, made Cassirer’s philosophy fatally vulnerable to history. When the facts changed, Cassirer’s philosophical reflections looked utterly naïve. “Having witnessed the perversion of science, language, art, and religion during the First World War,” writes Skidelsky," the younger generation felt ill inclined to accept Cassirer’s vision of the civilizing process" (126).

This may be one reason why so many of the student witnesses to the 1929 conversation between Cassirer and Heidegger felt that the older professor stood for an obsolete philosophy and that the younger man had achieved an almost Oedipal victory. (Cassirer was Heidegger’s senior by fifteen years.) Nevertheless I do not agree with Skidelsky that Cassirer “had no grip on Heidegger” (216). This is simplifying and it obscures much of the nuance of their discussion. The two were ultimately deadlocked, to be sure, but Cassirer had some canny things to say against Heidegger’s work, points he would elaborate at greater length in the notes later included in The Metaphysics of Symbolic Forms, the posthumously published “fourth volume” that swelled beyond the confines of his three-volume system. The opposite is also true: however much Heidegger may have benefited from a change in postwar cultural sensibilities, he also articulated some truly powerful objections to the neo-Kantian presuppositions that still animated Cassirer’s philosophy, and we should evaluate these objections on philosophical terms alone.4 Cassirer himself may have felt these objections were unfair, especially in light of the fact that he had tried himself to venture beyond the neo-Kantian constraints of his earliest training. Skidelsky also notes — correctly, I believe — that there was a subtext of anti-Semitism at work in Heidegger’s criticism. Cassirer and a number of the leading neo-Kantians in Germany at that time were Jewish, a fact that irked some German nationalist philosophers who complained that the editorial board of the journal Kantstudies was dominated by non-Germans who had no business expounding Kant. Shortly before the Davos encounter Cassirer was the object of another such attack by a Nazi philosopher (209). Heidegger himself expressed worries in private and in a letter to colleagues about Jewish influence on the German spirit, and in her memoirs Toni Cassirer suggests that she and her husband had heard rumors of Heidegger’s anti-Semitism even before their encounter in Davos. This may help to explain why, in the written records of the Davos debate as transcribed by O. F. Bollnow and Joachim Ritter, we find that Cassirer opened the discussion by complaining to Heidegger that neo-Kantianism had become the “scapegoat” (Sündenbock) of the newer philosophy. Skidelsky cites this complaint but unfortunately he seems to have relied upon an imprecise English translation where “scapegoat” appeared as “whipping boy” (214). This misses the obvious resonance of Cassirer’s statement. Nevertheless Skidelsky’s general point may still hold: Cassirer’s philosophy was a victim of changing times.

Skidelsky tells the overall story of Cassirer’s philosophical reception as a tragedy: “Seldom can an enterprise so splendidly conceived have met with such failure” (125). He even confesses in his introduction that he changed his mind while composing the book. Originally he aimed to write “a plea for Cassirer’s importance … against decades of neglect,” but eventually he concluded that fatal problems afflicted Cassirer’s work: "It was not just that many individual aspects of his system had fallen into disrepair, but that the whole thing was no longer obviously philosophy at all" (5). This is an astonishing statement and it is hard to fathom what it could mean. In Michael Friedman’s excellent study of the Davos encounter, A Parting of the Ways: Carnap, Cassirer, and Heidegger, we are told that the bitter misunderstanding between continental and analytic philosophy as embodied by Heidegger and Carnap might look to Cassirer as a messenger of reconciliation: his expansively cultural and historical perspective might appeal to partisans of continental philosophy while his rigorously logical groundwork and Kantian pedigree might earn him the respect of the analytic camp. It is a hopeful vision, though Skidelsky finds its success unlikely:

But most twentieth-century philosophy, analytic and continental, has sought a standpoint beyond the variety of culture — an absolute conception of consciousness, meaning, or the world. Viewed from this angle, Cassirer does not so much mediate between analytic and continental traditions as fall foul of them both. His “reconciliation” is on terms that neither can accept. (6)

Skidelsky’s point is that the very sense of what can legitimately count as “philosophy” today now excludes the sort of inquiry Cassirer wished to promote. But I believe part of Friedman’s message was that philosophy can and should broaden its self-definition. Skidelsky, however, seems to feel the train has left the station for good. Nevertheless he too implies that with the loss of voices such as Cassirer’s the discipline of philosophy has grown impoverished.

This helps to explain why the entire book is written in a melancholy key. It is a portrait of a philosopher who has passed irrevocably into history. For Skidelsky the world has passed Cassirer by and there’s little we can do about it. Sometimes, however, he overstates the case and permits himself a somewhat surprising stream of associations: “Culture itself,” he observes,

is now a tainted word. Heidegger’s exultation of bare existence, his denunciation of Geist as a refuge of the weak and dishonest, has filtered into popular consciousness. A thousand rock lyrics proclaim the authority of the immediate, the transient. (236)

What is being said here? Are we to understand that Cassirer was right but our culture is wrong? Or that all philosophies are just their time apprehended in thought? The final verdict of the book, if I understand it correctly, would seem to be Cassirer’s philosophy no longer accords with current political intuitions and is therefore of merely historical interest. This sort of judgment is commonplace but if made into a generalized principle of interpretation it is ill-conceived. Nobody expects that a philosophy must prove its worth by peddling the political instrumentality of its claims, and a great many important philosophical insights have little practical utility at all. The difficulty in Cassirer’s case would seem to be that he actually promised his philosophy of symbolic forms could serve as a universal theory of human expression in all of its various domains, and he saw the history of human symbolization as a history of “man’s progressive self-liberation.”

Skidelsky is therefore right to ask how the emancipatory promise in Cassirer’s work might be cashed out and if that promise still holds validity for us. Less convincing, I think, is Skidelsky’s attempt to frame all of Cassirer’s legacy as ultimately dependent upon its political merits. Skidelsky closes his book with a chapter on Cassirer’s politics as if political-philosophical insight were the highest sort of insight to be derived from Cassirer’s work. Cassirer’s “failure” turns out to be the failure of a certain high-minded rational liberalism animated by a nearly religious belief in the salvific potentials of culture. But to portray Cassirer as a failure on these political grounds may be to judge him by standards he did not try to meet. Leo Strauss once condemned Cassirer’s philosophy for its “aestheticism” — its failure to ground its claims in an ethico-political argument and its willingness instead to rest content with a largely apolitical inquiry into cultural symbols. For Strauss, this failure made Cassirer a perfect embodiment of all the weaknesses of Weimar liberalism, its unworldliness and its hesitation in the face of power. But Strauss was a great simplifier. He believed that politics — and for him this almost always meant totalitarian politics — will eventually force us toward stark conclusions. This is one reason the Davos debate (about which Strauss heard reports only second-hand from his friend Kurt Riezler) appealed to him: it fit rather too neatly into his portrait of philosophical modernity as an endgame between strong nihilism and toothless liberalism for which the only solution was a return to premodern political rationalism. These are crude and ultimately unphilosophical ways of thinking about philosophical argument. It is clear that Cassirer was not a sophisticated exponent of political liberalism, but it is unclear whether this means he was a failure, since it is not at all certain he wanted to be a political philosopher. The conceit of Cassirer’s political obsolescence may carry a partial truth, but its continued hold over scholarship is rather too powerful. If we wish to understand Cassirer’s very own purposes, it may prove more helpful if we were to try to forget, at least momentarily, the awful times in which he lived.

1 A slower and more painstaking introduction is the now-classic study, Cassirer: Symbolic Forms and History (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1987), by the doyen of Cassirer-studies John Michael Krois, who teaches at Berlin’s Humboldt University and has also worked tirelessly in cooperation with other editors to produce a scholarly edition of all of Cassirer’s works and published papers.

2 Quoted in Skidelsky, 66, from Cassirer, Substance and Function, trans. Swabey (Open Court, 1923), 277.

3 Quoted in Skidelsky, 121, from Cassirer An Essay on Man: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Human Culture (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1944), 207.

4 On the Davos encounter and its meaning, there is a long list of discerning interpretation. In English see Michael Friedman, A Parting of the Ways: Carnap, Cassirer, and Heidegger (Chicago: Open Court, 200). Also see the excellent volume by Dominic Kaegi and Enno Rudolph, eds., Cassirer-Heidegger: 70 Jahre Davoser Debatte (Hamburg: Meiner Verlag, 2002). Also critical are the following essays: Frank Schalow, “Thinking at Cross Purposes with Kant: Reason, Finitude, and Truth in the Cassirer–Heidegger Debate,” Kantstudien (hereafter KS) 87 (1996), 198-217; Calvin O. Schrag, “Heidegger and Cassirer on Kant,” KS 58 (1967), 87-100; Dennis A. Lynch, “Ernst Cassirer and Martin Heidegger: The Davos Debate,” KS 81 (1990), 360-70; Wayne Cristaudo, “Heidegger and Cassirer: Being, Knowing and Politics,” KS 82 (1991), 469-83; John Michael Krois, “Aufklärung und Metaphysik: Zur Philosophie Cassirers und der Davoser Debatte mit Heidegger,” Internationale Zeitschrift für Philosophie (Stuttgart: J. B. Metzler), Heft 2 (1992), 273-89; Pierre Aubenque, “Le Débat de 1929 entre Cassirer et Heidegger,” in Ernst Cassirer: De Marbourg à New York, L’itinéraire philosophique, ed. Jean Seidengart (Paris: Les Éditions du Cerf, 1990), 81-96; and Karlfried Grüunder, “Cassirer und Heidegger in Davos, 1929,” in Uber Ernst Cassirers Philosophie der symbolischen Formen, ed. Hans-Jürg Braun, Helmut Holzhey and Ernst Wolfgang Orth (Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Verlag, 1988). And see my own book, Peter E. Gordon, Continental Divide: Heidegger, Cassirer, Davos (Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press, forthcoming Spring 2010).