(Book 1) Ironic Technics; (Book 2) Postphenomenology and Technoscience: The Peking University Lectures

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Don Ihde, Ironic Technics, Automatic Press, 2008, 57pp., $12.00 (pbk), ISBN 9788792130181.

Don Ihde, Postphenomenology and Technoscience: The Peking University Lectures, SUNY Press, 2009, 92pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781438426228.

Reviewed by David R. Cerbone, West Virginia University



This pair of slim volumes presents in condensed form Ihde’s distinctive take on the philosophy of technology, which combines the two key terms in the title of the longer volume: what Ihde calls “postphenomenology” and “technoscience”. The volume bearing these two words in its title consists of a series of lectures Ihde delivered at Peking University in 2006; the other volume consists of four freestanding, though thematically linked essays. Despite their brevity, there is a great deal of repetition within and across these two volumes, and so rather than deal with them serially, I will mainly concentrate on singling out the key ideas and theses the two works share, taking passages from either or both as needed.

Ihde’s notion of postphenomenology serves as something of the master-concept in his view, and so it may be best to begin with it. If we confine ourselves at the start just to Ihde’s choice of terminology, the principal question appears to be one concerning how to situate Ihde’s notion in relation to what it presents itself as succeeding, namely phenomenology. There is, of course, no single notion of phenomenology — Husserl hiumself changed his conception of phenomenology over his career, and the various “existential” phenomenologists such as Heidegger, Sartre, and Merleau-Ponty offered their own distinctive takes on the notion — and this makes the task of delineating a successor method a rather delicate maneuver (one may be a post-Husserlian phenomenologist, for example, but still be doing plain old phenomenology in, say, Heidegger’s sense). What makes Ihde’s approach phenomenological is its appropriation of several key ideas from the phenomenological tradition — and especially from Husserl — which are then projected into a new domain, namely the philosophy of technology. Ihde claims that technology is not just a particular object of study, but is itself a way in which experience is mediated. This means that intentionality itself — the principal subject matter of phenomenology in the traditional sense — is modified by technology: "Technologies can be the means by which ‘consciousness itself’ is mediated. Technologies may occupy the ‘of’ [in the ‘consciousness of ____’ formula of intentionality] and not just be some object domain" (PT, p. 23). What I take this to mean is that technology can play an adverbial role with respect to intentionality, so that it is not so much what we experience (some technological object) as a way we experience: we experience things technologically in that technology modifies — sometimes modestly, sometimes radically — both what and how we experience the world. Postphenomenology is interested in documenting these forms of mediation, and so Ihde’s discussions abound with examples where technology has shaped the object domain (e.g. the popular song, whose length was determined by the limits of recording technologies) and opened up new domains for exploration (considerable attention is devoted to imaging technologies).

The “post” prefix carries some weight for Ihde: earlier phenomenology’s attachment to a traditional, epistemology-centered conception of subjectivity is something Ihde wants to overcome; he also does not hanker after essences in the traditional Husserlian sense (Ihde is proudly anti-essentialist, which makes for difficulties that I’ll enumerate below). None of these rejections, however, is tantamount to a rejection of phenomenology as a whole: the displacement of traditional subjectivity and a rejection of Husserlian essences mark many schools or styles of phenomenology. Indeed, rather than flat out abandoning or superseding phenomenology, Ihde’s practice is, by his own lights, “a modified, hybrid phenomenology” (PT, p. 23) and "a nonsubjective and interrelational phenomenology" (PT, p. 11). Thus, despite Ihde’s choice of terminology, we are not perhaps as far afield as it seems. Ihde clearly sees his work not just as inheriting from phenomenology, but as continuing it as well. However, these claimed lines of continuity are not always entirely clear, as I will try to explain below.

The three key concepts that Ihde appropriates from phenomenology are the late Husserl’s notion of a lifeworld; phenomenology’s distinctive concern with embodiment; and the notion of multistability, which Ihde refers to occasionally using Husserlian terminology as eidetic variation. Ihde devotes considerable attention to the notions of multistability and variation, and it is worth considering in some detail his deployment of these notions both to illustrate Ihde’s views, but also to raise some questions concerning his inheritance of phenomenology. To establish a baseline, recall Husserl’s notion of eidetic variation, which he understood to be a technique used by the phenomenological practitioner to facilitate the apprehension of essences: by engaging in the activity of “free variation”, the phenomenologist would thereby vary the given contents of her experience while reflectively tracking the results. By noting when the given contents both withstood and failed to withstand variations, that would provide insight into what was essential and what was contingent with respect to those contents. Whatever the merits of Husserl’s technique, it is not what Ihde has in mind; indeed, he is dismissive of essentialist thinking, preferring instead to align himself with pragmatist and postmodern lines of thought. Instead, Ihde’s thinking proceeds from a different kind of variation, familiar to fans of Gestalt psychology and Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations, namely, the kind of perceptual variation that Wittgenstein called “seeing aspects”. What was of interest to Wittgenstein, as well as many other philosophers and psychologists, is the way the perceptual field can be reorganized into a variety of stable patterns without any change in the perceived object. For example, the picture from Jastrow over which Wittgenstein lingered can be seen either as a duck or as a rabbit, but never both simultaneously. We can see the picture one way or the other (or at least most of us can), and when we have seen the picture both ways, we can also experience the “flip” or Gestalt-switch (though we may not always be successful in inducing the switch-over). Minimally, what these phenomena show is that perceptual organization is not solely a function of the features or properties of the perceived object (since those are constant through the perceptual variation), but that “something more” is involved in perceptual experience. Just how to understand that extra something is, of course, far more controversial.

Ihde spells out his own interest in variational multistability by rehearsing and adding to these largely familiar examples. Part of what interests Ihde is the indefiniteness in the range of stable patterns: while we may commonly notice only two or three stable variations, many more may be shown to be lurking with enough patience and effort (Ihde claims to have found several additional variants of the Necker Cube, for example). This kind of interest in perceptual multistability evinces Ihde’s affiliation with phenomenology, as these sorts of phenomena are grist for the phenomenologist’s mill (it is hard to see how a phenomenology of perception — of whatever stripe — could not be interested in, and feel the need to give an account of, perceptual multistability). What is murkier are the phenomenological credentials of Ihde’s extension of these notions into the domain of technology, since it is not clear how the range of cases he considers constitute multistable variations in ways at all analogous to the perceptual cases. Consider one of his central examples in Postphenomenology and Technoscience: archery. In one sense, archery constitutes a single technology: a particular means (a tensed string, attached at either end of a curved frame (the bow)) for propelling a projectile (the arrow) toward a target, usually for the purpose of killing it. Archery has been around for a long time and has flourished over the centuries across numerous cultures. Given the diversity of cultural contexts and the breadth of archery’s historical existence, it is not surprising that there is a great deal of diversity within the single practice of archery: different cultures have developed different versions — or variants — of archery, ranging from the longbow, to mounted archery (i.e. archery deployed by horsemen), and Chinese artillery archery, to cite Ihde’s three examples. For Ihde, what this diversity shows is that the technology of archery is a multistable phenomenon: each variation is a stable organizational variant on the single technology, archery. As Ihde sees it, we have in the example of archery the diversity-within-sameness of the kind found in the examples of perceptual variation. Indeed, Ihde refers to these variants of archery as “phenomenological variations” (PT, p. 18) and notes that "this practice [archery] is also multistable in precisely its phenomenological sense developed in the earlier examples" (PT, p. 16).

But just how precise is Ihde’s identification here? Notice that part of what was interesting about multistable perceptual variation was the total constancy of the perceived object: the perceptual experience was thoroughly different — indeed, experiencing one pattern excludes experiencing it the other way — though the drawing or figure was not itself altered or rearranged (no lines were added or deleted, redrawn or reworked). What goes proxy for this kind of constancy in Ihde’s examples? After all, the different forms of archery are materially different; in each case, the bows, strings, and arrows have been differently fashioned, often with different materials, and nothing about one excludes the other, except in the trivial sense that something cannot be both a longbow and an artillery bow at the same time (just as a duck cannot be a rabbit, but we don’t need phenomenology to tell us this). The duck-rabbit phenomenon would be far less interesting philosophically and psychologically if one were to draw two separate pictures — one a duck, one a rabbit — and claim them as variants of one another (both are made with a pen, say, or chalk, or are rendered in the same style). What remains constant across the diversity is the notion of archery, schematically described, but it is not especially surprising that this schema might be filled out in more than one way. Consider all the styles, kinds, makes of automobiles the average driver sees on any given day: are these “phenomenological variations” of one another? Does the variety of cars show that automobile technology is multistable in “precisely its phenomenological sense”? And what of tools and devices that manifest something more like (but still not reaching) multistability in the phenomenological sense (now it’s a can opener, now a paring knife; call your friends, then take a picture; and so on)? Is that a different kind of multistable variation?

Phenomenological or not, Ihde thinks we learn something from reflecting on these variations within a form of technology. What we see is that technology is embedded in a lifeworld, and in ways that reflect the embodied dimensions of practice. The difference between a longbow, say, and one used in mounted archery, reflects the broader differences in lifeworld of the respective users: a longbow would be incredibly unwieldy on horseback, and a standing archer would sacrifice speed and power by using a bow suited for mounted archery. Both designs, moreover, accommodate the human body in predictable ways. While Ihde’s observations on this front strike me as right-headed, there is also something unsurprising about them. That is, here and elsewhere, it is not entirely clear just who would disagree with Ihde’s claims. Who, for example, would deny that patterns of use affect the ways in which tools are designed or configured? A casual stroll through a good hardware store or a museum displaying weaponry through the ages will attest to this, and so it is hard to see how this “finding” depends on a sophisticated philosophical method called “postphenomenology” for its revelation.

A similar lack of surprise attends other claims put forward by Ihde. In the opening essay of Ironic Technics, cleverly titled “Stupidity in a Knowledge Society”, Ihde announces: "I shall argue that the shapes and forms of stupidity, and for that matter all knowledge, is relative to the modes of communication and technologies employed in whatever type of society it may be" (IT, p. 2). How startling or exciting a thesis is this really? Is there something being claimed here that is worthy of argument, in the sense of admitting of an interesting back-and-forth of provocative assertions and counter-assertions? Consider a possible example of the kind of “relativity” Ihde is here arguing for: without automobiles, roads, and the human all too human practice of driving, one cannot display the various forms of stupidity (drinking alcohol before hitting the road, driving without sufficient sleep, talking on the phone or texting (!!) while driving, and so on) that constitute bad driving. What this boils down to is that one cannot be a bad driver without all the technologies of driving. Who exactly would disagree with this kind of claim? This comes close to what Wittgenstein would call a “grammatical remark”, which is a way of deflating the air of substantiality from Ihde’s “thesis” (“A whole cloud of philosophy condensed into a drop of grammar” [Philosophical Investigations, p. 189]).

The italics in Ihde’s claim concerning “shapes and forms of stupidity” just cited, which underscore the relativity of knowledge to technologies, indicates the second of Ihde’s two distinctive notions, what he calls technoscience. The amalgamated character of this term reflects Ihde’s conception of science and technology as intertwined with one another. Science is not “pure theory”, which then may be “applied” in various technologies; rather, what is knowable scientifically is conditioned by what is technologically feasible, such "that only through being technologically mediated is the newly produced knowledge possible" (PT, p. 55). Or, as Ihde puts it slightly thereafter, “without instrumental mediation, no experience of such phenomena is possible at all — no instruments, no science” (PT, p. 57). As Ihde acknowledges, this view of the entanglement of science and technology has become prevalent in philosophy of science circles, and has served to dispel the more theory-driven models of science championed in the heyday of logical positivism.

Leaving the task of exorcising the ghost of positivism aside, there is again something remarkably unobjectionable about Ihde’s claims. Consider microscopes. Surely, they have played a key role in the progress of science, and it is unclear, to say the least, how science would have managed to come up with a whole range of hypotheses, models, and theories without them. Everything from cellular structure (and cells themselves) to the discovery of viruses to the finer points of crystallization would most likely remain unknown apart from having such technologically enhanced visual powers. So, to choose just one example, it seems safe to say that without microscopes, there would be no detailed knowledge of cellular division. But the safety of this claim is precisely what makes it less than philosophically revelatory. Is there anyone who would disagree? Are there rival views, such that theories of cellular division were dreamed up in the realm of pure theory, only to be handed over for testing and confirmation to the folks in the lab working the microscopes? Apart from a few positivist bogeymen, Ihde does not engage with any challengers to such claims, and I suspect that it is because few, if any, are to be found.

There is perhaps a more controversial way of reading Ihde’s claims concerning technoscience, which involves a more radical gloss on the contention that knowledge is relative to the technologies prevalent at a time. In keeping with his commitment to the phenomenological notion of the lifeworld, Ihde at several points tends toward a stronger claim regarding the way science and technology are embedded in a lifeworld. Thus, when Ihde says that “in a deep sense, science cannot escape the lifeworld” (PT, p. 32), one wonders just how deep that sense is supposed to be. Does it mean that the truth of what science tells us about the world is somehow relative to the lifeworld in which that science is practiced? While it seems right to say that such truths could not have been revealed or discovered without those practices and so without the myriad conditions that enabled and sustained those practices, it seems far less palatable to say that the truths themselves are dependent in any stronger sense. It is not clear to me that Ihde embraces a stronger version of dependence. Consider the following: “It is my contention that all science, or technoscience, is produced by humans and either directly or indirectly implies bodily action, perception, and praxis” (PT, p. 46). Notice that the first conjunct seems trivial: who would deny that science is a human achievement (or production)? Even the most theory-driven positivists would assent to this. The second conjunct looks more contentious, though a great deal hangs on the nature of the implication. Is the implication a causal one, a constitutive one, a semantic one, or is there some other way of construing the relation between the two? I could not find anything approximating an answer to this question throughout these two books.

Throughout these two works, Ihde favors the idiom of construction when talking of science and knowledge, which again suggests a more radical form of relativization than just causal dependence. Ihde describes his activity as “looking at historical scientific practices and the ways in which these construct the knowledge of the time” (PT, p. 48). But what makes what gets “constructed” knowledge, rather than just, say, reigning belief or doctrine? What’s built into the qualification "knowledge of the time"? Does that mean what was called “knowledge”, what passed for knowledge or got taken as or treated as knowledge? Could it turn out later to be false? Does that diminish its status as having been knowledge? It is not as easy as Ihde sometimes depicts it to shrug off more traditional epistemological concerns. When Ihde writes on a subsequent page that “the ancient knowledge of heavenly cycles and observable phenomena remains valid into the present” (p. 50), what does validity mean and what impact does Ihde’s claim of continued validity have on his claims concerning the “situated” character of science and knowledge? Doesn’t its continued validity imply a trans-lifeworld notion of validity and knowledge? Shortly thereafter, Ihde notes that “the richness of the world is far from being known, even in postmodernity” (PT, p. 62). This remark sounds realistic enough, such that there are things to be known about the world, apart from what is technologically feasible at a particular time. Just how this squares with the view that knowledge is “constructed” is not clear, unless “constructed” carries little in the way of philosophical bite. A measure of the notion’s toothlessness may be the extent of its dispensability. So, when Ihde claims that “wherever they first appeared, lenses introduced possibilities for the construction of radically new scientific knowledge” (PT , p. 51), we (and Ihde) would do well to ask what the phrase “the construction of” adds philosophically to this claim. Suppose he simply said, “Lenses introduced possibilities for new scientific knowledge.” What is being omitted by leaving out the extra phrase?

Ihde’s appeal to “technoscience” underscores the centrality of his interest in technology and its role in shaping the character of human life. Ihde describes his approach to technology as “empirical” by which he means that he attends to “both histories and examinations of actual technologies” (PT, p. 62). Ihde contrasts this empirical approach with previous philosophical accounts of technology: “Early work on technology tended to be transcendental, or ‘general.’ The focus was on technology as though it were a single, reified thing” (PT, pp. 27-28). While there may be merits to avoiding undue reification, we still face the question of just what technology is. Even if we are careful always to use the plural, so that there are many technologies, we still need some criteria to distinguish the technological from the non-technological. Otherwise, just what is being claimed when one attempts to document the mediating role of technology on, say, perceptual experience, is left unclear. Even if technology is not “a single, reified thing”, surely there is something distinctive being indicated or described by “technology” (or “technologies”), but Ihde does not tell us wherein this distinction (or family of distinctions) lies. Indeed, Ihde does not even see technology as a specifically human achievement: "Material technologies are older than modern humans (homo sapiens sapiens)!" (PT, p. 38). Claims in this direction would appear to drain the notion of any of its thicker significance, since “technology” just seems to mean something along the lines of “using something to do something”. But then why stop with earlier humanoid life-forms? Given Ihde’s anti-essentialism, don’t sea otters, chimpanzees, and even birds employ a variety of “technologies”? If the meaning of “technology” is that diffuse, however, how can one formulate philosophically significant theses about “it”?1

The more “transcendental” and “general” prior accounts that Ihde eschews — the later Heidegger’s, in particular — were motivated by the sense that there was something shallow about standard accounts of technology and, further, that such shallowness overlooks or neglects what is distinctive about specifically modern technology. What Heidegger contended was that modern technology was not simply an assemblage of better means to a variety of ends, but a distinctive “way of revealing”, which he named Gestell (usually translated as “enframing”). Ihde is well aware of Heidegger’s account, but he sees it as tied to a conception of technology that has been superseded, what he refers to as "the kind of megatechnologies that Heidegger characterized as Bestand und Gestell" (PT, p. 39). In the opening essay of Ironic Technics, Ihde recounts a panel discussion in which he participated, where the “highpoint” was “hypermodernist” Jaron Lanier’s claim that the later Heidegger’s characterization of technology as “enframing”, as “challenging” nature as a framework of resources, “was really that of ‘rustbelt, industrial technology’ … and not that of contemporary electronic-information technology” (IT, p. 3). In Postphenomenology and Technoscience, Ihde again cites approvingly Lanier’s contention that “Heidegger’s notion of technology owes more to industrial than to electronic technologies” (p. 40). This sort of claim, of which Ihde clearly approves with only slight qualification, strikes me as dead wrong. First, the very phrase gives the game away, as “electronic” connotes the need for, and the use of, electricity, whose production involves the kind of “challenging” described by Heidegger. Witness, for example, the enormous electricity demands of “server farms” that power search engines like Google; proponents of modern computing who fixate on its more ethereal-sounding aspects (Ethernet, cloud computing, wireless, and so on) seem to forget the vast material underpinnings of the digital age (and do not forget the vast quantities of landfill taken by the near-constant parade of superannuated machines, whose obsolescence looms just beyond their unpacking). Ihde, in support of Lanier’s claim, cites the tendency toward miniaturization and lower energy use as hallmarks of the new technology (IT, p. 5), but this focuses only on the situation of the end-user, not the vast networks that support these micro-machines. Beyond this, modern digital technology as well as emerging nanotechnologies exhibit just the character Heidegger so presciently described roughly fifty years ago: what better exemplifies the idea of a flexible, switchable, indefinitely rearrangeable, intrinsically meaningless resource than the bits and bytes of a digital computer, as well as the bits of energy those machines are perpetually exploiting?

Ihde further contrasts the kind of mass-scale labor of industrial technology with the way “electronic entertainment, communication, and information technologies seem to take a different direction by placing users into connections with each other, providing play time, and even empowering people in different ways” (IT, p. 5). Surely, however, this is a non sequitur, as it contrasts the uses of electronic technology with the modes of production characteristic of industrial technology. The end-uses of industrial technology likewise place users “into connections”, provide “play time”, and even “empower people”. Think of cars: I can much more easily connect with people farther away, I can take “road trips” to beaches, mountains, fields, and streams, I can expand my opportunities for work, and so on. Ihde’s claim further ignores the labor-power invested in all of the underpinnings of the “play time” that the end-users of modern technology enjoy. Think of all the coding involved in e-mail platforms, search engines, web browsers, word-processing programs, Guitar Hero, and so on. The writing of these codes enlists the labor of many individuals, and much of the work affords a great deal in the way of drudgery. Ihde acknowledges that the new electronic technology has not replaced older, industrial technologies, but has instead been added to them (IT, p. 6). However, even his more modest claim that the new technologies are “qualitatively different” is only sustained through misleading comparisons.

The final lecture in Postphenomenology and Technoscience introduces another Ihde-esque term of art, what he calls “material hermeneutics”. What this phrase is meant to indicate is the sensitivity of material entities to the activity of interpretation, such that meaning or significance can be read out of, rather than just into, what are otherwise non-linguistic items. Ihde uses as his central example the work done to decipher one set of early human remains, which was only recently discovered in glacial ice. This early human — dubbed Otzi — was the subject of intense conjecture by archaeologists and paleoanthropologists, and it was only with the use of sophisticated dating and imaging techniques that scientists were able to piece together the story of Otzi. For Ihde, this again illustrates the role of technology in scientific inquiry, since he contrasts these modern techniques with “what knowledge concerning Otzi could have come from classical archaeological analyses” (PT, p. 71). (Notice that Ihde’s remark here again raises the question of just what he means by knowledge: is there a fact of the matter about Otzi? And if so, in what sense are what classical and contemporary archaeological analyses tell us both knowledge, if they conflict with one another? Can the different “knowledges” “produced” or “constructed” by different scientific practices even be compared on the merits; can one “knowledge” defeat another?) This, however, is not the only lesson of the Otzi case: “I take this as an example of a material hermeneutic, in which ‘things’ are given voices: pollen, grain, metal, and tooth enamel have all ‘spoken’ in spite of being situated in a context that itself is without proper linguistic phenomena” (PT, p. 72). But there’s nothing non-linguistic about the “context”, if one includes the presence of investigators and their various interests in figuring out who Otzi was. Rather than the misleading metaphors of voice and speech, why not just say that all of these things constitute evidence, data, clues, that they serve as traces that can be used to make inferences regarding a past event or situation? As with Ihde’s talk of knowledge being “constructed”, one suspects that the hip, trendy-sounding talk of “material hermeneutics” could be deleted without substantive loss. Indeed, what their deletion reveals is the pedestrian character of what are presented as provocative claims.

A final, less philosophically oriented remark about Ironic Technics. The volume has a cobbled-together feel — publishing via a method not much beyond Xeroxing and stapling — as the papers do not share a common format (some have abstracts, others do not; some have “key words” listed at the outset, others do not), and the publication abounds with various kinds of typographical errors (I counted one or more on at least twenty of the volume’s scant 57 + vii pages). Admittedly, this is an inexpensive volume (published, perhaps too tellingly, by Automatic Press), but priced at $12 and being only a little over sixty pages total, it is hardly a giveaway, and so one would hope for a bit more care in preparing a manuscript for press.

1 I am indebted to Iain Thomson for this point, though I do not know if he would agree with my way of developing the worry. See his Heidegger on Ontotheology: Technology and the Politics of Education (New York: Cambridge UP, 2005). See especially p. 48.