These two collections of essays bring us up to date on John McDowell’s philosophical production since Mind and World.1 Other than one essay on Plato’s Sophist from the early ’80’s that did not make it into McDowell’s earlier collections, everything in The Engaged Intellect (EI) was originally published in 1995 or later, while the contents of Having the World in View (HWV: EKHS) date from 1998 or later. The volumes exhibit great range, as one would expect with McDowell. In this review, it is impossible to summarize each of the 33 essays. Instead, I will selectively highlight essays in The Engaged Intellect, but focus on one thread that ties Having the World in View into a more unified volume.
The Engaged Intellect contains 19 essays in six sections: “Ancient Philosophy”; “Issues in Wittgenstein”; “Issues in Davidson”; “Reference, Objectivity, and Knowledge”; "Themes from Mind and World Revisited"; and “Responses to Brandom and Dreyfus”. The volume’s title seems a little odd — under such a title one would normally expect to find someone dealing with issues of contemporary social and political concern, and there is none of that here, though perhaps I’ve read too much Sartre. McDowell’s own explanation of the title is that it summarizes a theme running through the pieces: an insistence that humans possess a particular form of reason, which does, indeed, distinguish humanity from other animals, but which, nonetheless, cannot be divorced from our animal nature. Theoretical intellect is necessarily engaged with the animal, sensory capacities, and practical intellect with both the motivational propensities associated with feelings and the animal capacities for physical intervention in the world. McDowell’s notion of engagement, then, echoes the themes that many now broach under the rubric of ‘embodiment’.
The essays contained in these volumes are definitely exercises in professional philosophy, complex and dense. Nevertheless their range is breathtaking, both historically and topically, from Plato and Aristotle through Kant and Hegel to Wittgenstein and Davidson, from metaphysics and philosophy of mind to epistemology and ethics.
In "Falsehood and Not-Being in Plato’s Sophist", McDowell lauds G. E. L. Owen for showing us how to understand the Sophist as “a sustained and tightly organized assault on a single error” (EI: 3). Nevertheless McDowell thinks that Owen has not fully taken advantage of the tools he uses. McDowell aims to explicate Plato’s treatment of falsehood as exploiting the same moves Plato used to resolve the problem of negation. This essay is substantially older and more scholastic than the other essays in the book, and will be of interest mainly to specialists in Ancient Philosophy.
The next three essays, “Eudaimonism and Realism in Aristotle’s Ethics”, “Deliberation and Moral Development in Aristotle’s Ethics”, and “Incontinence and Practical Wisdom in Aristotle” hang together around some common themes. In “Eudaimonism and Realism in Aristotle’s Ethics”, McDowell argues for an Aristotle who is (1) a moral realist (where moral realism is the minimal notion that there is right and wrong in ethical judgment), but whose moral realism (2) does not possess a foundationalist structure in which moral values are based on or derived from primitive non-moral values (e.g., biological needs).
However, McDowell’s Aristotle is also a particularist for whom moral reflection begins from "the that" and who provides for a move to "the because" only when "the that" is not clear. McDowell traces the popular belief that Aristotle’s ethical thought exhibits a foundationalist structure to the idea that supplying the because for the that takes the form of grounding one’s particular moral judgments in external and independent values. But McDowell suggests a different way to supply the because: coming to comprehend the that by appreciating how one’s hitherto separate perceptions of what situations call for hang together, so that acting on them can be seen as putting into practice a coherent scheme for a life (EI: 34). McDowell calls this a “Neurathian vision”, and he suggests that this is adequate for realism: “Indeed, wherever the Neurathian image is the right image for reflection (which might be argued to be everywhere), that is the only kind of reason there can be for supposing that some putative sense of how things are is correct” (EI: 35).
Yet this picture, as McDowell acknowledges, does not slide entirely smoothly onto Aristotle, for in the Neurathian vision, whenever there is conflict or incoherence in the structure, everything involved in the incoherence is potentially at risk. Because Aristotle doesn’t seem to think that reflection can put the that at risk, McDowell proposes that Aristotle be amended to recognize that any particular ethical judgment is potentially defeasible.
This is not, McDowell insists, a major revision to Aristotle’s ethics, and, in particular, does not disrupt the moral realism he attributes to Aristotle. Nevertheless it does reveal another motive for attributing a foundationalist structure to Aristotle’s ethics: the attempt to find some ahistorical basis of moral judgment that would respond to the objection that Aristotle presents us only with the moral belief system of a privileged but highly restricted group. McDowell rejects such a strategy; the modern concern with historical contingency and cultural specificity just wasn’t a concern among the Greeks and it is anachronistic to saddle Aristotle with a response to it. Perhaps more importantly, “organizing our metaphysics around the idea of transcending historicity is profoundly suspect. Its true effect is to undermine the very idea of getting things right” (EI: 38). So McDowell sees foundationalism here to be at odds with the moral realism he finds in Aristotle. The Neurathian vision is sufficient to support realism; even in science there is a prospect of getting things right or wrong “not because scientific inquiry transcends historical determination of its lights, but because its lights stand up to reflective scrutiny” (EI: 39).
Given McDowell’s rather low threshold for realism here and his eagerness to defend moral realism, it is puzzling to me why, in numerous essays in the other volume (HWV: EKHS) he finds Sellars’s scientific realism contemptible as a form of “scientism”. We will return to this issue in the discussion to come.
In “Deliberation and Moral Development in Aristotle’s Ethics”, McDowell continues his attack on foundationalist readings of Aristotle’s ethics. Here the target is what McDowell calls the “blueprint” view of moral deliberation, in which a clear distinction is made between having a correct vision of the telos of human activity (the “blueprint”) and using the best means to realize it.
McDowell complains that this makes the goal of human activity look like the product of a distinguishable process, although a good life is a certain way of living and not a final state. The blueprint model also does not account for Aristotle’s particularism, which is a matter of correctness of perception rather than either validity of inference or proper application of principle. McDowell explains, “There is nothing for a correct conception of doing well to be apart from this capacity to read situations correctly … seeing them in the light of the correct conception of doing well” (EI: 49). Learning to read situations correctly requires nothing over and above proper upbringing — and here we connect to the previous essay — for what warrants our actions is not being grounded in extramoral values and executed by a good inference engine, but the coherence of one’s values and their ability to withstand reflective scrutiny.
“Incontinence and Practical Wisdom in Aristotle” responds to David Wiggins’s claim that Aristotle does not sufficiently acknowledge the space between thought and action in his treatment of akrasia. According to Wiggins, Aristotle should have acknowledged the importance of certain “executive virtues” that enable the phronimos to bridge the gap between what he knows to be good and what he actually does. McDowell contends that Wiggins does not understand the role of Aristotle’s description of the phronimos, which is not intended to apply to the general case in which an agent feels the attraction of the worse, despite his understanding it to be the worse. The true phronimos, McDowell contends, will not even feel the attraction of the worse and thus is in no need of any “executive virtue”.
The essays in EI Part II on Wittgenstein fit into McDowell’s overall project by worrying about aspects of the proper treatment of rationality and its relation to our physical or animal natures. In “Are Meaning, Understanding, etc. Definite States?” McDowell argues that of course Wittgenstein believed that there are mental acts and states but denied that they are in any sense occult states or events in some mysterious medium (such as an immaterial soul). McDowell, however, seems to think that the brain, about which we still know relatively little, also counts as an occult or mysterious medium. The mistake is in thinking that there is anything more to a mental state “than what is correctly attributed by moves in a language-game that we know how to play” (EI: 92). That is, if we know how properly to play the language-game that includes (correctly) clarifying one’s usage by saying "I meant that p" or "I was referring to x“, we know everything there is to know about the states of meaning and understanding. McDowell seems to think that a deeper explanation of what is the case with one who understands or means is not only not necessary, but misleading.”NDPRBodyTexT0">“How Not to Read Philosophical Investigations: Brandom’s Wittgenstein” is one of McDowell’s many arguments with his colleague Robert Brandom. McDowell argues that Brandom should not claim Wittgenstein as a precedent for his own project of grounding concepts and other normative entities in a more basic layer of (linguistic) practices:
There is no reason to suppose there must be a level of normativity below the level at which linguistic practice is described in terms of explicitly using this or that concept, and it is no concern of Wittgenstein’s to suggest that there is (EI: 98).
As far as I can tell, Brandom and McDowell are talking past each other in this exchange.
For instance, there is a good deal of discussion of §201 of PI: "What this shews is that there is a way of grasping a rule that is not an interpretation, but which is exhibited in what we call ‘obeying the rule’ and ‘going against it’ in actual cases."2 McDowell gives what he calls a “paraphrase” of it:
we must not suppose that, say, a sign-post can tell someone which way to go only under an interpretation. We must insist on not being deprived of the thought that a sign-post itself points the way, tells people which way to go (EI: 101).
But this is certainly a strange paraphrase, since the original expressly mentions the notion of “grasping a rule”, and there is no mention of this or anything like it in the so-called paraphrase. Brandom draws the conclusion from §201 that “The rule says how to do one thing correctly only on the assumption that one can do something else correctly, namely apply the rule”3, which McDowell claims invokes “two kinds of correctness”, one “that can be understood as conformity to rules, and the background correctness that on pain of regress cannot” (EI: 102). But surely Brandom doesn’t think there are two different kinds of correctness: there are two different cases of correctness and two different ways of achieving correctness, but not two different kinds of correctness.
Whereas the two essays on Wittgenstein intend to show how others get Wittgenstein wrong, the three essays in EI Part III attack parts of Donald Davidson’s philosophy. “Scheme-Content Dualism and Empiricism” reads Davidson’s distinction between scheme and content in terms of Kant’s distinction between concept and sense, and McDowell thinks that Davidson gets the interaction between these elements of experience wrong. Davidson takes the sensory only to be a causal occasion for the conceptual and must give up the fundamental idea of empiricism, i.e., the notion that the deliverances of the senses are epistemically significant. “Scheme-content dualism is incoherent,” writes McDowell
because it combines the conviction that world views are rationally answerable to experience — the core thesis of empiricism — with a conception of experience that makes it incapable of passing verdicts, because it removes the deliverances of the senses from the domain of the conceptual (EI: 125).
What we need, McDowell argues, is a conception of experience that combines the sensory and the conceptual, a conception of experience that we find in Kant and in Sellars. While Davidson equates the notions of a world-view and a scheme, McDowell thinks that a world-view is the product of a scheme and some content. Thus, while Davidson thinks we can “have a world in view” simply in virtue of possessing a scheme, McDowell believes this is possible only if we have both a scheme and content in interplay with each other.
“Gadamer and Davidson on Understanding and Relativism” prosecutes several agenda. The lesser task is responding to Michael Friedman’s charge that McDowell turns out to be an Idealist for whom the world is a creature of our mental activity (we’ll return to this issue later); the greater task is an interesting comparison between Davidson and Gadamer on interpretation. McDowell argues that Davidson’s principle of charity plays roughly the same role as Gadamer’s notion of the fusion of horizons, but these thinkers diverge on whether it is built into the notion of an understanding consciousness that it shares something with others, a language or tradition. Davidson argues for the primacy of idiolects over shared, public languages; Brandom, like Davidson, also gives an "I-thou conception of the sociality of language" (EI: 148). But this is where McDowell favors Gadamer. McDowell argues that an I-we conception of the sociality of language and thought is perfectly unobjectionable, and he does “not believe Davidson ever considers the thought that shared languages might matter for the constitution of subjects of understanding” (EI: 145). Recognizing the constitutive role of language and tradition is one of Gadamer’s strengths.
EI Part IV contains four essays concerned with “Reference, Objectivity, and Knowledge”. “Evans’s Frege” is a defense of major points in Gareth Evans’s interpretation of Frege. The argument is that
Evans’s Frege enables a synthesis between acknowledging that contextual relations between subjects and object matter for determining the contents of thoughts, on the one hand, and giving full weight to the idea that thinking is an exercise of rationality, on the other (EI: 185).
This is a significant essay, but it is too complex to summarize here.
Essay 11, “Referring to Oneself” is a complex journey through Wittgenstein, Anscombe, and Strawson (with no mention of Shoemaker) on understanding the first person singular pronoun. There seem to be two basic goals in the essay. One “is to point to the basic importance of agency for making self-consciousness intelligible” (EI: 201). The other is to argue that “A potential for reflectiveness belongs to thought as such” (EI: 201). These are laudable purposes, but McDowell could be clearer here about the structure and the means of his argument. For instance, he relies on an unexplicated notion of ‘knowing through intention’ that cries out for further elaboration.
“Towards Rehabilitating Objectivity” is McDowell’s response to Rorty’s attack on the notion of objectivity, which he thinks is infantile. Rorty is right to object to foundationalist projects in epistemology and in morality, argues McDowell, but the proper response is not to reject the discourse of objectivity. It is to diagnose the deformations to which discourse is prone.
“The Disjunctive Conception of Experience as Material for a Transcendental Argument” is a response to the kind of scepticism which grants that perceptual experiences are appearances to us of an apparently objective world but claims that no such experience can justify the belief that the world is as presented. Such a sceptic thinks that the warrant afforded by experience can be only that of the “highest common factor” between seeings and appearings, and thus, only the warrant of an appearance. McDowell responds that a proper “disjunctive conception” of experience — namely, that “perceptual appearances are either objective states of affairs making themselves manifest to subjects, or situations in which it is as if an objective state of affairs is making itself manifest to a subject, although that is not how things are” — affords a kind of transcendental argument against any such scepticism (EI: 231). If this is disjunctivism, which McDowell finds even in Sellars’s treatment of appearance talk, then to me it seems a pretty innocuous doctrine. The transcendental argument in question seems to be a lost-contrast argument that we cannot make sense of (visual) appearance talk unless we can also make sense of seeing talk. McDowell points out that the claim that appearings and seeings are (in themselves) indistinguishable can be either (1) a disputable claim about the phenomenology of perception or (2) a way of saying that our perceptual capacities are fallible. Neither of these entails sceptical consequences.
So far, so good, but I lose McDowell when he gets into a response to Crispin Wright’s criticism of his disjunctivism. McDowell asserts flatly that, “The canonical justification for a perceptual claim is that one perceives that things are as it claims they are, and that is not a defeasible inferential base” (EI: 236). As far as I can see here, a ‘perceptual claim’ is not a claim about a perception, but a claim that expresses (at least part of) the content of a perception (the example given is Moore’s “Here is a hand”). The canonical justification for such a claim, therefore, is supposed to be that I see that here is a hand, and this, it is claimed, is not defeasible. I find this very confusing. Is the idea that my claim “Here is a hand” is justified, because, in fact, I see that here is a hand, which latter fact I need not have access to? This would be indefeasible, because it is the fact that is the justifier, and facts are not defeasible; only statements are. But the idea that facts justify claims needs to be treated with great care. Alternately (consistent with the talk of an ‘inferential base’), perhaps the idea is that the claim is justified because of the availability to me of the inference
I see that here is a hand
Therefore, here is a hand.
The premise “I see that here is a hand” is itself surely defeasible. So McDowell’s claim seems to force him into an externalist position on epistemic justification, which he elsewhere disavows.
The essays in EI Part V, "Themes from Mind and World Revisited", further explore the notions of experience and nature that McDowell put forth in Mind and World. “Naturalism in the Philosophy of Mind” echoes in greater detail a theme of Essay 5, that understanding the mental is independent of understanding the brain. Both essays in this part could as well have appeared in the other volume.
EI Part VI presents McDowell’s disputes with Brandom and Hubert Dreyfus. McDowell points to several weaknesses in Brandom’s inferentialism: he thinks Brandom neither allows the world to play a large enough role in determining the content of our thoughts, nor properly recognizes the role of self-consciousness or reflection in the constitution of a rational being. The dispute between McDowell and Dreyfus concerns who is less Cartesian and better able to accommodate embodiedness in his conception of a person, a minded being.
In Having the World in View: Essays on Kant, Hegel, and Sellars, McDowell collects the essays that it seems to this reviewer are at the heart of his current interests. It takes its title from his Woodbridge Lectures4 (which is why I use the full abbreviation HWV: EKHS for the book), which constitute the opening three essays of the book. Continuing the fundamental theme of Mind and World, the basic question is how rational animals relate in experience and action to the world in which they live. Epistemological scepticism about our knowledge of the external world is not the problem McDowell has in focus here, but what he takes to be a deeper problem: how is it possible for thought to be about an objective world at all? Methodologically, McDowell shares with Sellars the belief that “Philosophy without the history of philosophy, if not empty or blind, is at least dumb.”5 McDowell pursues his philosophical agenda by playing off his great predecessors Kant, Hegel, and Sellars. Hegel emerges as the ultimate hero, even though he receives less (and a less thorough) mention than either Kant or Sellars. Kant and Sellars both turn out to be flawed heroes, philosophers of vision and scope who nonetheless committed fatal errors. Hegel alone escapes fundamental reproach. McDowell and Brandom, despite their often stark disagreements, are coming to be known as the Pittsburgh Neo-Hegelians, though how deeply Hegelian they are is still unclear.
The great insight shared among these three thinkers is the realization that experience is a unity of sensibility and understanding. McDowell writes,
Kant’s ‘clue’ is that the kinds of unity in virtue of which multiple actualizations of representational capacities in sensory consciousness cohere into a single intuition presenting objective reality to a subject, are the same as the kinds of unity in virtue of which multiple actualizations of representational capacities in discursive thinking cohere into a single judgment, in which a subject commits itself as to how things stand in objective reality (HWV: EKHS: 94-95).
Among other things, this means that there can be no such thing as non-conceptual experience, no sense in which “sensibility by itself could make things available for the sort of cognition that draws on the subject’s rational powers” (HWV: EKHS: 257). “Making available” for cognition is what Sellars used to call an “accordion” phrase that can be stretched in different directions, but McDowell takes this doctrine also to exclude the idea of a non-conceptual component to experience.
Kant and Sellars do not work this insight out properly, according to McDowell. In both cases, the principal error, in McDowell’s eyes, lies in the treatment given sensibility. Kant’s distinction between the Aesthetic and the Analytic encourages the idea that the forms of intuition are distinct in kind from the forms of thought, the categories, and apply to the deliverances of sensibility independently of them. Furthermore, Kant’s repeated insistence that space and time are solely the forms of human intuition condemns his transcendental idealism to being, despite his intentions, a form of subjective idealism:
When Kant makes it look as if the forms of our sensibility are brute-fact features of our subjectivity, it becomes difficult to see how they could also be forms of the manifestness to us of what is genuinely objective (HWV: EKHS: 102-03).
Few people are entirely happy with the details of Kant’s attempt to stitch together (the forms of) sensibility and (the forms of) thought, but McDowell’s analysis of it seems unsatisfying, for he argues that
Kant’s attempt to secure objective validity … for the requirements of the understanding founders, because although he manages to represent the unity of our formal intuitions, qua intuitions, as a case of a kind of unity that can be understood only in terms of its role in free intellectual activity, nevertheless something else remains outside… . We can conceive that ‘something else’ … as the matter of our formal intuitions (HWV: EKHS: 79).
I would think that a purely formal intuition would, in fact, have no matter at all. The matter of intuition, Kant tells us, is always sensation, and the task of the Aesthetic is to convince us that space and time are special in that they are pure, that is, without sensory content (= matter), yet nonetheless intuitions — singular representations related immediately to an object. McDowell seems to think he needs to correct Kant by insisting that pure intuitions have no matter, but I cannot see that Kant ever thought otherwise.
Sellars also found fault with Kant’s treatment of space and time:
Kant does not seem to have found the happy medium between the absurdity of saying that Space is a form of outer sense in that the manifold of outer sense is literally spatial, and the overly strong claim that the only way in which spatial relations enter into perceptual states is as contents of conceptual representations (SM, I ¶77: 30).
Sellars proposes that Kant needs to distinguish the forms of sensibility strictly so-called, which would pertain to “the characteristics of the representations of receptivity as such”, from the space and time in which our conceptual representations (including our intuitions) locate their objects. Indeed, this move becomes crucial to Sellars’s own attempt to transcend transcendental idealism, for it backs the claim that, whatever the particular formal characteristics of the representations of receptivity (sensations) as such, the (corrected and conceptualized) space and time in which we locate the objects of our conceptual experience are by no means subjective and dependent on “brute-fact features of our subjectivity”.
McDowell, however, doesn’t accept Sellars’s diagnosis of Kant’s problem nor his attempt to resolve it, for that would mean taking the notion of sensation, a non-conceptual state of consciousness that is a component of experience, seriously. McDowell seems to think that even if such a state could not itself be identified as an experience, but only as a component of an experience, such a view would ensnare us in the Myth of the Given. McDowell’s dislike for Sellars’s conception of sensations or sense impressions runs through a number of the essays in this volume, but I cannot say that McDowell has a firm grasp of it. For instance, in “Sensory Consciousness in Kant and Sellars”, McDowell claims that Sellars understands sensations as states or episodes exhaustively characterizable as modifications of the subject’s state, but he gives no text to back up the claim, and it does not seem to do justice to Sellars’s concept (HWV: EKHS: 111, 118). It is true that Sellarsian sensations have no intentional directedness — we do not characterize them by describing what they are of where that is the ‘of’ of intentionality. Nevertheless it is crucial to Sellars’s conception of sensations that they are conceived of as possessing properties that involve them in relations of similarity-and-difference that are analogous to the perceivable relations among the perceptible objects that typically cause them. These are not intentional characteristics of sensory states, but they are not exhaustively characterizable as modifications of the subject’s state, for they are truly and importantly characterized as homomorphic to certain ranges of properties of physical objects.
(While we’re at it, there are several other respects in which McDowell seems to get Sellars wrong. For example, McDowell thinks that Sellars holds that manifest (or, in the Kantian sense, phenomenal) objects are simply unreal because Sellars has a prior commitment to scientific realism (HWV: EKHS: 98-99). But (1) this gets the order of Sellars’s argument wrong. Sellars argues from the inadequacy of the manifest framework, together with a transcendental commitment to realism, to the doctrine of scientific realism, not the other way around. (2) It also falsifies the nuance of what Sellars means by saying that manifest objects are phenomenal and thus not real. In this latter regard McDowell needs to re-read SM V, Section XII, ¶¶95-102: 148-50, where Sellars explicitly sets out the sense in which "the objects of the manifest image do really exist".)
It is Sellars’s view that
If … Kant had developed the idea of the manifold of sense as characterized by analogical counterparts of the perceptible qualities and relations of physical things and events he could have given an explicit account of the ability of the impressions of receptivity to guide minds, endowed with the conceptual framework he takes us to have, to form the conceptual representations we do of individual physical objects and events in Space and Time (SM I, ¶78: 30).
McDowell, however, distinguishes between a sensation’s causing a conceptual representation and its guiding our conceptual activity. If sensations are merely causal intermediaries in cognitive activities, they play no essential epistemic role; if they do have an essential epistemic role and thus really guide our conceptual response, they must already possess normative status and conceptual form. Sellars’s view, according to McDowell, either falls into the coherentism for which he criticizes Davidson, or it falls back into the Myth of the Given.
So McDowell offers us a different picture: "The thinkings that provide for the intentionality of perceptual cognitions are not guided by sensory consciousness, as it were from without. They are sensory consciousness, suitably informed" (HWV: EKHS: 119). Sensation is not a separable element in perceptual experience; it is a mere abstraction from such experience, arrived at by abstracting from the full intentional directedness of perception. We conceive of sensations by abstracting from the spatiality of intuitions, say, by starting with the concept of an intuition of a translucent pink cube, abstracting from its spatiality, and thus generating the concept of a sensation of translucent pink (see HWV: EKHS: 120-121). This, however, is a view that puzzles me, for even if, under this conception, I do not locate the pink in objective space, it makes sense (and is indeed often true) to say that my sensation itself is shaped or bears a spatial relation to another sensation. A sensation of pink could be to the right or the left of a sensation of blue, even if both are afterimages without objective spatial presence. Furthermore, to be fully Kantian, we’d have to give a parallel treatment to the temporal aspect of the sensory, and the idea of a sensory state in abstraction from all temporal properties puzzles me even more.
McDowell’s treatment of sensory consciousness, which is connected to his disjunctive theory of perception, generates other problems as well. McDowell is committed to there being two kinds of thoughts: those that are also shapings of sensory consciousness, and those that are not. Perceptions or Kantian intuitions are shapings of sensory consciousness that reveal the layout of the world; thinkings or believings without phenomenal qualities are not shapings of sensory consciousness at all. One might think there is a third category: thinkings that are incorrect shapings of sensory consciousness, that is, shapings of sensory consciousness that do not, in fact, reveal the layout of the world. These would include illusions, hallucinations, etc. For McDowell, however, these cannot constitute a third category; they are thinkings that seem to be shapings of sensory consciousness but are not such shapings. When thinking does not shape sensory consciousness correctly, it does not shape it at all; it only seems to shape it (HWV: EKHS: 124).
What, then, are we to make of sensory consciousness itself? It can be shaped by our concepts, but only in veridical experience; in other kinds of experience it only seems to be shaped by our concepts. I have some difficulty with the idea of something that can be shaped, but only correctly. One concern, then, is that McDowell has left us with an essentially empty conception of sensory consciousness that is invoked to distinguish perception from abstract thought but cannot be investigated in its own right. McDowell thus seems to have fallen on one of the horns that Sellars says threatens Kant, namely, "the overly strong claim that the only way in which spatial relations enter into perceptual states is as contents of conceptual representations", which eventually leads to “reduc[ing] the concepts of receptivity and sensibility to empty abstractions” (SM, I ¶77: 30).
But in McDowell’s view, the idea that spatial relations enter into perceptual states only as the contents of conceptual representations is not a problem; it is the solution to Kant’s difficulties:
When Kant makes it look as if the forms of our sensibility are brute-fact features of our subjectivity, it becomes difficult to see how they could also be forms of the manifestness to us of what is genuinely objective. But when, in the move Hegel applauds, Kant puts the forms of our sensibility on a level with the categories, he takes a step towards making it possible to see the forms of our sensibility, no less than the categories, as genuinely forms of cognition — at once forms of subjective activity and forms of genuine objectivity with which that activity engages (HWV: EKHS: 102-03).
The reason Hegel emerges as the hero here is that he makes just the move McDowell thinks is called for, putting the forms of sensibility on the same level as the categories as basic forms of unity both in our judgments and in our intuitions, and thereby as basic forms of the unity of objects themselves.
This allows us to clarify the sense in which McDowell is an Hegelian and an idealist. His idealism is not a form of the claim that the world is a projection from our subjectivity, nor is it the claim that the substance of the world is mental, that all that exists are minds and their perceptions. Those are idealisms “in the sense in which to call a position ‘idealism’ is to protest that it does not genuinely acknowledge how reality is independent of our thinking” (HWV: EKHS: 142, quoting from Mind and World: 26). We can get at McDowell’s sense of idealism through his discussion of the Tractarian dictum that “The world is everything that is the case” (Wittgenstein, Tractatus, 1). McDowell says that the dictum spells out “truistically, the content of an unimpeachable way to use the notion of the world” (HWV: EKHS: 143). He asserts,
And if we do say that [the world is everything that is the case] and mean it, we conceive the world, not … as a totality of the describable things — zebras and so forth — that there are (as we say) in it, but as precisely, everything that can be truly thought or said: not everything we would think about if we thought truly, but everything we would think (HWV: EKHS: 143).
As McDowell immediately acknowledges, “This is an idealism in an obvious sense. On this conception, the world itself is indeed structured by the form of judgment” (loc. cit.). The world is the totality of facts (is itself one big fact?), facts are logically structured, so the world is logically or conceptually structured. At least part of what this means is that causal structure is not the fundamental structural form in the world.
McDowell’s idealism is a form of logical realism, which he has elsewhere described as a kind of naturalized Platonism (an oxymoron, according to some).6 We thus get a different parsing of the realism/idealism distinction than has been common in the English-speaking tradition. Sellars is not an idealist, on this score, because he thinks of the world as the totality of objects, and he denies that it makes sense to attribute logical structure to objects themselves, though, of course, our concepts of objects have logical structure. (Yet Sellars is an idealist about facts, because he thinks fact-talk is just material-mode truth-talk, and truth is a metalinguistic predicate and therefore mind-dependent.) Kant is a transcendental idealist because he holds that the phenomenal objects that are available to human experience must exhibit both logical (i.e., categorial) and spatio-temporal structure, but does not think it makes sense to attribute such structure to things as they are in themselves. (This sounds like it forces a “two-world” interpretation of Kant, but it need not.) For Hegel and McDowell, logical structure determines the bounds of sense — not the bounds of the sensory, but the bounds of intelligibility. Idealism in this sense is the belief that the world must be potentially intelligible. If it were not potentially intelligible, it would not even be the kind of thing we could think about. (The double modality in the notion of the “potentially intelligible” is called for to account for the fact that what is currently unintelligible to us need not be unintelligible absolutely.) The key to McDowell’s idealism is his realism about the normative, both the logical and moral: there is normative structure to the world, and thinking beings are the entities that respond to that kind of structure. Thus realism and idealism ought not to be seen as mutually exclusive.
We can see this in McDowell’s argument with Pippin. Pippin sees Hegel as operating within the Enlightenment’s (in particular, Kant’s) rejection of both naturalism and rationalistic intuitionism concerning normative authority in favor of a theory that depends crucially on the idea of self-legislation to explain not just our recognition of norms but their creation as well. But this anti-realist and constructivist approach to norms (also shared by Brandom) cannot do justice to Hegel’s view, which McDowell argues requires realism about norms. Mc Dowell writes, “Responsiveness to reasons, the very idea of which is inseparable from the idea of communal practices, marks out a fully-fledged human individual as no longer a merely biological particular, but a being of a metaphysically new kind” (HWV: EKHS: 172). McDowell thinks that a tenable realism must forgo the idea that the objects in our world are unmediatedly independent of the practices of inquiry concerning them:
If we allow the label ‘realism’ to fit wherever there is a subject matter that enjoys some independence with respect to our practices of inquiry, then realism becomes available about norms no less than about the subject matter of the natural sciences (ibid.).
But why, one then has to ask, is McDowell so vociferously opposed to scientific realism, which he invariably castigates as a form of “scientism”?
In English-speaking lands throughout the 20th century and beyond, calling someone an Hegelian idealist has been a significant philosophical insult. McDowell’s arguments and his (relatively recent) willingness to brand his view a form of Hegelian idealism might help remove an undeserved onus from one of history’s great thinkers. But it might also have the effect over time of marginalizing McDowell from “mainstream” analytic philosophy. Only time will tell that story, but it would be a tragedy if the kinds of issues about which McDowell worries and the texts with which he chooses to engage get pushed to the side. There is much in McDowell I find hard to understand, much I find to disagree with, but I welcome his voice and his choice of issues.
5 Wilfrid Sellars, Science and Metaphysics: Variations on Kantian Themes, The John Locke Lectures for 1965-66 (Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1967). Reissued in 1992 by Ridgeview Publishing Company: Chapter I, ¶1: 1. [Henceforth cited in the text as SM, with chapter, paragraph, and page numbers given.]