Bottlenecks, A New Theory of Equal Opportunity

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Joseph Fishkin, Bottlenecks, A New Theory of Equal Opportunity, Oxford University Press, 2014, 269pp., $35.00 (hbk), 9780199812141.


Reviewed by Ann E. Cudd, University of Kansas


Joseph Fishkin's new book begins with the question: why do we care about equality of opportunity? He answers that it is not primarily because we care about equality in itself, but rather because opportunities are so valuable to us. Opportunities offer the freedom to develop our capacities and define who we are. Inequalities should matter to us insofar as they prevent us from grasping opportunities to develop our capacities and live flourishing lives. But equality of opportunity has proven elusive to define precisely and defensibly. Fishkin argues that we should instead focus on the structures of opportunities that society offers and see how they can be expanded. He analyzes two ideal types of social structures of opportunities: unitary and pluralistic. In a unitary opportunity structure there is a single hierarchy of opportunities and everyone has the same preferences about jobs and social roles, whereas in a pluralistic structure people hold diverse views about what constitutes a good life, and what jobs and social roles they want to hold. Since the pluralistic structure offers more possibilities for a flourishing life, Fishkin argues in favor of what he terms "opportunity pluralism," the idea that society ought to move its structures of opportunity away from the unitary model and toward the pluralistic model. Thus he replaces the substantive (but elusive to define) goal of equality of opportunity with a procedural goal to expand and diversify opportunities for everyone.

The main obstacles to opportunity pluralism are what Fishkin terms "bottlenecks." Bottlenecks differ across time and place; they are specific to a society and its structure of opportunities. There are three kinds of bottlenecks. Qualification bottlenecks occur when accessing a particular opportunity requires a certain narrowly defined qualification, such as a bachelor's degree. Developmental bottlenecks occur when there are critical, developmental opportunities that people must pass through in order to develop important abilities or skills, such as learning how to read, that are needed to pursue the paths society offers. Instrumental-good bottlenecks occur when people need some instrumental good, such as money, in order to achieve their goals. Fishkin defends what he calls the "anti-bottleneck principle," which is that we should work to eliminate those bottlenecks that reduce opportunity pluralism by eliminating them or helping people through and around them.

The implications of opportunity pluralism often resemble the prescriptions of other theories of equal opportunity, such as recommending that we eliminate racial discrimination, educational inequalities, socioeconomic segregation, and the prescriptive gender-role system. But opportunity pluralism does not immediately condemn material inequality, and instead suggests that we want to encourage the type of capitalism that offers labor market flexibility and multiple possibilities to start small firms. Recognizing that some bottlenecks are legitimate, we should sometimes help people through bottlenecks and in other cases help them to find a route around them or eliminate them through law.

In the first chapter (after the introduction), Fishkin discusses and rejects standard theories of equal opportunity. He poses four problems for defining and defending an ideal of equal opportunity. First the problem of the family is that families offer different advantages and disadvantages to children, beginning from the very earliest stage of life. Because we value family life as a fundamental good and basic right, we cannot eliminate this source of inequality. The second is the problem of merit. Rawls' conception of fair equality of opportunity requires that we define merit in a way that tracks talent and effort, and does not reflect the circumstances of birth and their advantages. But Fishkin argues this is not really possible; because of the problem of families, as well as other sources of inequality in developmental opportunities, talent and effort is inextricable from circumstances of birth and subsequent advantages. The third is the problem of the starting gate, or the point at which we say everyone has been provided with an equal chance of success and from here on they compete on an equal playing field. Fishkin argues that there is no place a starting gate can reasonably be placed such that equality is thereafter guaranteed. Each outcome is another opportunity, so at each point a new source of inequality arises. The final problem is the problem of individuality. This is a problem for theories of opportunity that attempt to equalize opportunities at specific bottlenecks. But this only serves to narrow the structure of opportunities around those bottlenecks, and if the structure is narrow, then equal opportunity narrows the plans of life open to people. If opportunity structures encourage a single vision of what counts as success, then equalizing those opportunities just serves to create a narrow range of possible ways of life. By making the structure of opportunities more pluralistic, we lower stakes and reduce the magnitude of the problems of family, merit, and starting gate.

The second chapter aims to develop a more systematic account of the underlying dynamics that cause these four problems by looking at how context, environment, and individual characteristics combine to create differences in observed abilities and talents. It offers an interesting and to my mind successful critique of the assumption, which underlies both environmental and genetic determinism, that heredity and environment are separable. Fishkin argues instead that our talents and abilities are nurtured and developed in society through the developmental opportunities we receive, the institutions and forms of life that we can fit into or imagine, and our individual capacities. For example, a child who is told she has an ability may cause that child to work hard in that area, which in turn develops the ability beyond that of other children, leading to more opportunities to develop that talent. Fishkin writes:

Our ambitions, goals, and efforts do not emerge fully formed from the ether, but are instead products of our lived experience; they, in turn, influence other aspects of the processes by which we develop traits and capacities, convince others to recognize our capacities, prove our "merit," and secure jobs and other social roles. (p. 115)

Furthermore, society rewards talents only if recognized, and the recognition of talents and abilities is subject to implicit, subconscious biases. What counts as an ability or disability is thus developed, constructed, and recognized socially. This accounts for why merit cannot be separated from luck, and for why there cannot be a single starting gate from which subsequent outcomes are achieved purely through merit.

Fishkin then argues that individuals' preferences and goals are endogenous to the opportunity structure. For example, without the fully developed structure of youth and professional sports, few individuals would form the preference to become an accomplished athlete. Thus the development of individual preferences and ambitions depends on the socially available opportunities. If there are not many available opportunities, then there will not be a diversity of preferences, which accounts for the problem of individuality.

In the third chapter Fishkin lays out his argument for opportunity pluralism, which consists in the following four claims or principles. (1) There should be a plurality of values and goals in society. (2) As many as possible of goods should be non-positional and of the valued roles, non-competitive. (3) As much as possible, there should be a plurality of paths to these different goods and roles, without bottlenecks -- the anti-bottleneck principle. (4) There should be a plurality of sources of authority regarding the elements in 1-3.

Of these, the pivotal one, as well as the most interesting and potentially controversial one, is the anti-bottleneck principle. Bottlenecks are to be discouraged unless they serve some legitimate purpose because they tend to require individuals to pass through a similar test or supply a similar credential, and they reduce the number of options for living for those who do not pass through. Fishkin discusses the institution of the Gymnasium in Germany as a bottleneck that sorts children at a relatively young age into those who will and those who will not have the opportunity to attend university and become professionals. The anti-bottleneck principle calls for a variety of preparatory institutions and credentials that develop skills and experiences for a wide variety of roles. Community colleges in the U.S. represent anti-bottleneck opportunities because they serve adults at a wide variety of stages in life, from a wide variety of backgrounds, and offer the opportunity to switch tracks within and between occupations.

In discussing these academic examples it becomes clear that some bottlenecks may be desirable, however. Admissions criteria in university set a bar for achievement that incentivizes study and hard work. They create classrooms that are challenging. More generally, bottlenecks can create an atmosphere of competition that has good aspects, bringing out the best in everyone. Finally, bottlenecks can serve to level the playing field in some ways by setting out clear criteria that mitigate the influence of connections and invidious discrimination.

Fishkin's analysis here is somewhat less convincing and could be expanded. A bottleneck is "legitimate" he says to the extent that it serves a goal we find to be legitimate. He offers some examples of distinguishing legitimate from arbitrary bottlenecks. For example, anti-discrimination law allows bona fide occupational qualifications. For educational institutions, he says that the question of legitimacy requires an inquiry into mission. But of course some missions might not be legitimate; to defend a mission imposed bottleneck we would need to inquire into the legitimacy of the mission itself. Fishkin argues that there is a legitimacy-arbitrariness spectrum, and that even arbitrary qualifications are only problematic when they create a bottleneck. The existence of Christian colleges is not problematic since they don't create bottlenecks for occupations, so the fact that they may have arbitrary admissions criteria is not problematic.

Fishkin argues that to pick out the right bottlenecks to ameliorate, we need a thin, minimal conception of human flourishing. This conception will tell us how to implement opportunity pluralism, by telling us what sorts of developmental opportunities are to be provided to all. He opts for a capabilities approach to human flourishing because of its obvious connection to the development of capacities. This conception aligns with a relational theory of autonomy because of the way such a theory "identif(ies) a variety of mechanisms by which autonomy depends on and interacts with the social structures, norms, and relationships in which we are all embedded." (p. 197) This seems right to me as far as it goes, but more needs to be said about which social structures and norms are ones that deserve our support and encouragement, and which do not.

The final chapter takes up applications of opportunity pluralism and the anti-bottleneck principle. Fishkin argues that class is most pervasive of all bottlenecks. Fear of downward mobility creates bottlenecks because each wants to ensure that his children do well enough in the contest for money and wages, since money is an instrumental-good bottleneck. We need to help people through and around this bottleneck by making available developmental opportunities at low or no cost so that occupations that offer low pay do not close off those opportunities for persons who choose those occupations and their children.

College is another bottleneck closely related to the class bottleneck. A college degree has become a credential that is required for many occupations that previously did not require them. Yet, more than 80% of individuals from families in the top income quartile complete bachelor's degrees in the U.S., while less than 10% from the bottom income quartile. These facts mean that children from working class families will have far fewer options for moving into those occupations that require college degrees even though they may be well suited for them. Furthermore, there will be students from the top income group who are not well suited to or interested in going to college, yet unable to see or be interested in a way of life that does not require college. Both groups will face restricted opportunities, and of course the restrictions on the working class children are worse because of the opportunities that money and status can buy.

Fishkin discusses segregation and integration in terms of bottlenecks. One way that segregation creates a bottleneck is through restricting the networks of people that one comes into contact with. Networks matter in part because they help people see a variety of fulfilling ways of life. Integrated neighborhoods offer persons a diversity of different options for individuals to develop their capacities and interests. The final section of the book discusses bottlenecks and antidiscrimination law in detail and with many examples, and should be of great interest to legal theorists.

Overall the book is very well written and argued. Fishkin offers an original theory of how opportunity matters, and a vision of society that promotes flourishing rather than focusing on pinpointing injustice. Anyone with an interest in socially promoting freedom, opportunity, and diversity will be rewarded by engaging with Fishkin's concept of the bottleneck and his arguments for opportunity pluralism.