Brief History of the Soul

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Stewart Goetz and Charles Taliaferro, A Brief History of the Soul, Wiley-Blackwell, 2011, 228pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405196321.

Reviewed by Angela Mendelovici, The University of Western Ontario and the Australian National University, and Karen Margrethe Nielsen, The University of Western Ontario


A Brief History of the Soul presents a spirited, if unapologetically partisan, introduction to the history of thought on the soul. The book is the third installment in Blackwell's new "Brief Histories of Philosophy" series. Goetz and Taliaferro trace the history of views of the soul from ancient philosophy through to contemporary philosophy of mind. The story they tell is one of decline: while the existence of the soul was largely accepted in the past, the "history of the soul terminates with an age in which those who are learned deny the very existence of that which is the subject of this book" (p. 4). While the authors' project is largely historical, the book also seeks to revive interest in the soul and to defend its existence. To this end, the authors defend historical arguments for the soul and respond to contemporary objections. They cover a lot of ground, but, as we will suggest, neither the historical nor the argumentative projects are fully successful.

The book is divided into eight chapters. The first four are primarily historical, covering the soul in Greek, Medieval Christian, and Continental Thought (Descartes, with a coda on Malebranche and Leibniz), as well as the soul in Locke, Butler, Reid, Hume, and Kant. The second half consists of thematic chapters on "Soul-Body Causal Interaction," "The Soul and Contemporary Science," "Contemporary Challenges to the Soul," and "Thoughts on the Future of the Soul."

It is not entirely clear what Goetz and Taliaferro would count as a soul. They do not explicitly define the term "soul". They claim that "the position we hold would customarily be called substance dualism" (pp. 3-4). But since Aristotle and Aquinas are not substance dualists, yet are classified as believers in the soul, a charitable interpretation of Goetz and Taliaferro would not equate the view that there is a soul with substance dualism. Based on their classification of philosophers as believers or disbelievers in the soul, as well as various remarks, one suspects that the concept of a soul at play is a cluster concept, including most centrally the features of simplicity, immateriality, causal potency, substantiality, and being the bearer of mental states. Something counts as a soul just in case it has enough of these features.

We now turn to the book's historical project; the second half of the review discusses its argumentative project. Goetz and Taliaferro launch their investigation into the history of the idea that we are embodied souls by considering Plato's Phaedo, the earliest surviving defense of the simplicity and immortality of the soul. They then consider Plato's tripartition argument in Republic IV and its attendant problems. Drawing on John Searle, they claim to find a discussion of the "binding problem" in the Wooden Horse simile in Theaetetus 184c-d. Aristotle's hylomorphism is treated at length, and the section on Augustine draws on the work of the late Gareth Matthews, to good effect. From Aquinas, we head straight to Descartes, whose ideas are discussed in what is one of the best chapters in the book. The exposition is clear, and the challenges raised are relevant and interesting. This chapter sets the stage for some of the later thematic chapters. Locke's ideas about personal identity are discussed in a chapter that would have benefited from fewer quotations and even more analysis, and Hume and Kant make brief appearances toward the end. Hobbes is conspicuous in his absence.

In light of Goetz and Taliaferro's generous quotation practice, it would have been helpful if they always quoted standard translations. We doubt that Socrates, the scourge of obscurantism, would approve of the phrases placed in his mouth in Hackforth's 1961 translation: "The soul that hath seen the most of being shall enter into the human babe that shall grow into a seeker after wisdom and truth" (Phaedrus, 248d). "The human babe" translates "gonê andros", which means male semen (Nehamas and Woodruff get it right in John M. Cooper's Plato, Complete Works (Hackett 1997)). At times, terms that belong in Christian discourse make their way into descriptions of pre-Christian Greek philosophers. In the section on Plato, Socrates' friends are called his "disciples". Goetz and Taliaferro refer to the Athenians' desire for "worldly" goods as Plato's explanation of their defeat in the Peloponnesian War. But surely, the Greek counterpart to the New Testament contrast between "treasures on earth" and "treasures in heaven" (Matthew 6.19-21) is the contrast between goods of the body and goods of the soul. Such terminological infelicities may seem off-putting to readers who fail to share a Christian interpretive framework.

The choice of philosophers in the first two historical chapters is traditional -- traditional to the point where one may wonder if Goetz and Taliaferro made a conscious decision to opt for the tried and tested, or whether they have overlooked the renewed interest in Hellenistic and Neoplatonic philosophy over the past thirty years. In the chapter on ancient philosophy, the only thinkers discussed are Plato and Aristotle; in the chapter on medieval philosophy, Augustine and Aquinas rule alone. The omission of materialist schools of thought in the Hellenistic period leaves a skewed impression, especially since Epicureans and Stoics agree with Plato that the soul exists, but try to account for its nature in materialist terms. There is not a word in this brief history about the philosophically rich and influential discussion of the soul in Arabic philosophy -- Averroes' controversial interpretation of Aristotle's enigmatic remarks about the agent intellect in De Anima III, 5, isn't mentioned. Instead of a careful consideration of the reception of ancient thought, we get a peculiar paragraph toward the end titled "Cross-Cultured Inquiry". Goetz and Taliaferro here speculate that "As Western philosophy takes on board more Asian and African traditions, and as greater scope is given to Muslim philosophical projects, there is bound to be renewed expansive treatments of the soul". They add, "As we write, a conference is scheduled in Iran where Muslim and Christian philosophers will meet next year to discuss the soul and possible conceptions of the afterlife" (p. 211). If one didn't know better, one might think of this conference as a first encounter, like a summit between earthlings and Martians. To the extent that it makes sense to speak of "Western" philosophy, Arabic philosophy is an integral and important part of its history.

The historical project culminates in discussion of contemporary philosophy of mind, where materialism is widely accepted and the existence of the soul is denied. Goetz and Taliaferro describe and respond to worries about soul-body causal interaction raised by Ernest Sosa and Jaegwon Kim (chapter 5), challenges from contemporary science, such as some that arise from neuroscience and the causal closure of the physical (chapter 6), and a variety of other objections, such as Rylean and Wittgensteinian worries (chapter 7).

The treatment of the contemporary landscape leaves much to be desired. Goetz and Taliaferro misleadingly write as if the main alternative to the view that there is a soul is eliminative materialism. Non-eliminativist forms of materialism, property dualism, and panpsychism are tangentially discussed, but are not considered as real alternatives to the soul view. For instance, it is striking that David Chalmers' highly influential work on property dualism is not mentioned (Chalmers, 1996). (Jackson's (1982) knowledge argument against physicalism is mentioned, though it is not attributed to Jackson (p. 147).) The inadequate treatment of contemporary alternatives to dualism and eliminative materialism is unfortunate, because non-eliminativist forms of materialism and property dualism are arguably the main competing views in explaining (and in some cases, explaining away) most of the explananda that motivate the positing of a soul. It is also unfortunate that property dualism and panpsychism do not receive more discussion, since they are the soul view's closest contemporary cousins, and are motivated by many of the concerns that motivate the positing of a soul. It is also striking that, though the ideas are sometimes hit upon indirectly, the hard problem of consciousness (Chalmers, 1995) and the explanatory gap (Levine, 1983) are not explicitly discussed, since these arguably provide the main contemporary considerations against physicalism and in favor of alternative views, including substance dualism.

We now turn to the authors' secondary project, the argumentative project. They aim to defend a version of interactionist substance dualism on which the soul is a simple substance; this is the version of the soul view we will be concerned with in the remainder of this review. Goetz and Taliaferro revive historical arguments in favor of dualism by giving them a contemporary spin. The revivals are scattered throughout the book, but in most cases it is fairly easy to distill the basic idea. One such argument is an argument for the existence of a simple soul from the unity of consciousness. This argument has its roots in Plato's discussion of the Trojan horse in Theaetetus 184c-d (p. 18) and Descartes' fourth meditation (pp. 84-8). The basic idea can be reconstructed as follows: the existence of a simple soul best explains the unity of consciousness, and thus the unity of consciousness supports the existence of a simple soul. The discussions of this argument are interesting and suggestive, though it is not entirely clear how effective it can be without a thorough discussion of alternative accounts of the unity of consciousness.

Goetz and Taliaferro also revive an argument from the teleological explanation of behavior found in Aristotle and Aquinas. Again, the discussion of this argument is scattered throughout the book, but the main idea nevertheless comes across fairly clearly: We have first-person evidence that sometimes behavior is purposeful. Purposeful behavior cannot be determined by physical causes, but can (and perhaps can only) be the result of the activity of a non-physical soul. Therefore, there is a non-physical soul. However, it is far from clear that this argument is successful. The non-eliminative materialist is likely to claim that purposeful behavior can be determined by physical causes. She might offer a naturalistic story of purposes, perhaps in terms of beliefs, desires, and other intentional states, and maintain that her story, insofar as it allows for intentional states, allows for physically-caused but nonetheless purposeful behavior. Goetz and Taliaferro consider this kind of line of response and claim that what the materialist offers would not count as purposeful behavior, since purposeful behavior cannot be physically determined (pp. 167-8). In effect, their construal of purposeful behavior amounts to an incompatibilist view of free will. However, while it is fairly clear that we engage in some form of purposeful behavior, it is far from clear that we engage in purposeful behavior that meets the stringent criteria the authors have in mind.

Perhaps Goetz and Taliaferro's main contribution to current debates is their response to objections to the soul's existence. Chapter 5 is framed as a response to Ernest Sosa's (1984) challenge to the dualist to articulate the relation between a soul and a body such that the two causally interact with each other, rather than with other souls or bodies. In the case of physical causation, the relations accounting for which things causally interact are spatial relations, but souls are not spatially located, so this won't work for soul-body causation. It seems that the dualist must say that the facts concerning which soul interacts with which body are brute. Goetz and Taliaferro respond that there is a non-spatial pairing relation between souls and their bodies, and that the dualist is justified in believing this even if she cannot articulate what it is, since she has good arguments for dualism. Depending on the strength of the arguments in favor of dualism, this response may be adequate. However, the response does not address the challenge of specifying what this pairing relation is, and this counts against dualism. Goetz and Taliaferro also discuss an alternative response to Sosa's challenge: the dualist can say that the soul is indeed spatially located, and that the pairing relation is a spatial relation. Much of the remainder of chapter 5 is a response to various of Jaegwon Kim's (2005) objections to a spatially located soul.

Another, to our minds more important, objection to the existence of the soul that the authors address is that it does not sit well with the neuroscientific evidence: through localization studies and other means, we have discovered that the brain plays many of the causal roles that the soul was thought to play, and so there is no need to posit a soul to play these roles. Therefore, there is no soul. Goetz and Taliaferro respond, first, that the evidence does not rule out the possibility of a causal contribution of a soul to the generation of the relevant causal effects. Perhaps a soul plays an undetected role in causing neural activity. Second, Goetz and Taliaferro claim that proponents of the soul view do not posit the soul merely to explain certain causal effects; they have other arguments for the soul's existence. However, while all this may be true, it remains the case that the evidence from neuroscience best supports the view that something else, the brain, plays many of the causal roles that the soul is thought to play, such as generating behavior and serving as the vehicle of mental processing, and this provides evidence against the soul's existence. Thus, again, while the dualist might have something to say in response to the evidence from neuroscience -- after all, everyone can agree that the evidence isn't conclusive -- the evidence nonetheless weighs (arguably heavily) against dualism.

Chapters 5-7 succeed in showing that substance dualism has much to say in response to contemporary challenges, though, as we suggested above, the responses are not always fully satisfying. Insofar as Goetz and Taliaferro intend to make a case for dualism, it is not entirely clear how successful they are. One might worry that the negative points accruing from the responses to the various objections add up in such a way that the balance of evidence favors the view that there is no soul. In light of this worry, the book would have benefited from a clear summary of the main considerations for or against the soul view and an attempt to weigh them against each other. What we appear to have instead at several points is a weighing of all the considerations in favor of the soul against one consideration against the soul at a time.

Overall, the book provides some interesting discussions. Goetz and Taliaferro deserve praise for writing a philosophically engaged history of the soul. Instead of treating historical figures as archeological exhibits, they treat them as what they purported to be: philosophers, and hence as deserving of critical scrutiny and sometimes defense. Their attitude is one we would do well to cultivate in our undergraduates. However, the book is less clear and engaging than one would have hoped for a book of this type, and there are many inaccuracies, though most of them are fairly inconsequential.

The book appears to be intended for a general educated audience. Due to our reservations concerning the treatment of historical figures as well as prominent contemporary views, we would be reluctant to recommend this book as an undergraduate text. For students who already have a grasp of some of the authors or topics covered in A Brief History of the Soul, it may, however, provide inspiration for further reading.[1]


Chalmers, D. J. (1995). Facing Up to the Problem of Consciousness. Journal of Consciousness Studies, 2(3):200-19.

Chalmers, D. J. (1996). The Conscious Mind: In Search of a Fundamental Theory. Oxford University Press.

Cooper, J. M. (1997). Plato: Complete Works. Hackett.

Jackson, F. (1982). Epiphenomenal Qualia. Philosophical Quarterly, 32(April):127-136.

Kim, J. (2005). Physicalism, or Something Near Enough. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Lennon, T. M. and Stainton, R. J. (2008). The Achilles of Rationalist Psychology. Springer Press.

Levine, J. (1983). Materialism and Qualia: The Explanatory Gap. Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 64(October):354-61.

Sosa, E. (1984). Mind-Body Interaction and Supervenient Causation. In P. A. French, T. E. Uehling, Jr., and H. K. Wettstein (eds.), Midwest Studies of Philosophy, Vol. 9, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 271-281.

[1] Thanks to David Bourget, David Chalmers, and an anonymous reviewer for helpful comments and discussion.