British Idealism: A History

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W.J. Mander, British Idealism: A History, Oxford University Press, 2011, 605pp., $160.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199559299.

Reviewed by Andrew Vincent, Cardiff University


The author begins this book with an interesting, true, but nonetheless unexpected statement, namely that 'When I started researching twenty years ago it would not have been possible to write this history of British Idealism' (p. xvii). Developing this comment, Mander reminds us of something important and quite disturbing about British philosophy in the mid- to later- twentieth century -- if only pedagogically -- when he states that 'The chronicle of British philosophy as taught in our universities stops at Mill to start again with Russell and Moore, as though nothing at all happened in the intervening period. But when we seek to fill this gap what a surprise meets us' (p. 1). This 'intervening period' refers roughly to the years between the 1870s and 1930s. The surprise which Mander refers to -- astonishingly -- still remains true for many who teach philosophy today, namely, that there is an immensely rich and diverse body of philosophical literature in this intervening period, in Britain in particular, but also stretching way beyond Britain into the USA, Canada, Australia, South Africa and India.

Yet this literature has conventionally been totally ignored and excluded by the majority of philosophy departments in Britain. What characterizes this rich literature is what, in turn, has caused many twentieth-century philosophers to try to ignore or totally dismiss it. That is to say, the dominant broad motif of philosophy in this period was an ebullient and wide-ranging philosophical idealism. There was not (what would now be seen as) an analytic philosopher in sight during this period. There were realists, naturalists, empiricists who opposed Idealism, but nothing resembling the movement of British philosophy from the 1930s. Some of these post-1930 early opponents of the Idealist tradition have even gone to the point of suggesting that because they find it so objectionable, it is therefore not even to be considered genuine philosophy. Others have argued that the empiricist philosophies which faced Idealism were makeshift and poorly articulated, therefore Idealism arose in a philosophical vacuum. Thus, they maintain that, once a genuinely sophisticated philosophy arose in the 1930s, Idealism automatically collapsed. All this is part of the fairy-tale compensatory thinking of the twentieth-century analytic movement. In consequence, for many teaching and writing on philosophy, Idealism could be totally ignored in any serious philosophy curriculum. Thus, work on British Idealism, till comparatively recently -- in fact until the last twenty years -- was seen as otiose.

There are, though, various other ways in which this negative response has been configured. It would still be true to say, as Mander notes, that one of the key early founding 'myths' of the 'analytic movement' in Britain (analytic is a peculiar misnomer in many ways, since all philosophy has a strong analytical dimension) has been the idea that it came to prominence by refuting Idealism, or showing that it had little or no value as a philosophy. Yet, as Mander reminds us, Idealism was 'neither hopelessly confused nor obviously wrong' (p. 2). Further, and of even greater significance, Idealism was actually never refuted. In early analytic philosophy (for example, the work of the likes of Moore, Russell or Ayer) British Idealism was caricatured, self-consciously misinterpreted, misunderstood and ultimately in large part abandoned by the 1930s, often more out of ennui than anything else. But it is a complete falsehood to think that any works actually fully engaged with Idealism on a philosophical level. Neither G.E. Moore's 'Refutation of Idealism', nor Russell's various pre-1930 philosophical works, ever actually seriously addressed Idealism in its rich and complex content.

As Mander makes clear, none of Russell's or Moore's arguments, purportedly against F.H. Bradley, actually make any serious or well-worked out criticisms of him. Such arguments therefore generally bypass and miscast Idealism. Thus, for example, Idealism was often caricatured as adhering crudely to a coherence notion of truth and a doctrine of internal relations. To think, though, that all the British Idealists were so evenly and uncritically committed to such ideas shows a quite startling level of ignorance. There is nothing ultimately that disturbing in the fact that Idealism was rejected. The British Idealists themselves also came to prominence -- to a large degree -- through criticizing their predecessors. If there is a difference here from the early analytic movement, it is that the Idealists did quite self-consciously engage in an open philosophical confrontation and for a significant time their arguments largely prevailed over empiricism and naturalism. They did not simply refuse to address their opposition. Thus, for example, T.H. Green's main published work, whilst he was alive, was an edited critical edition of David Hume's writings. In many ways, paradoxically, Green reintroduced Hume as a valuable component of the British philosophical tradition. However, if one reads Green's extensive critical introduction, one wonders occasionally why he put so much time and effort into it, since overall it is a very finally grained and persuasive refutation of Hume's whole epistemological position.

British Idealism, as it crystallised in the 1870s, was unquestionably still something of a peculiarity in a culture characterised by an instinctive utilitarianism and the hard-edged empiricism of Thomas Hobbes and Jeremy Bentham. In many ways, as indicated above, after the interlude of Idealism, comparable forms of empiricism and an instinctive utilitarianism returned to prominence in Britain in the 1930s. Mander, in chapter two, gives a comprehensive, if quite conventional, account of this gradual development. The story of the rise of Idealism in the 1860s and 1870s covers the subtle and sometimes piecemeal impact of the writings and teaching of figures such as Coleridge, Carlyle, Hamilton, Ferrier, Grote, Jowett and Hutchison Stirling.

What was common to most of these was the fact that they had become acquainted with and were attracted by, to greater or lesser degrees, aspects of German culture and philosophy. German thought, in effect, exposed British intellectuals to a new philosophical and literary landscape and indeed metaphysical language. It also provided a range of philosophical tools to both analyse and assess the character of empiricist, associationist, sensationalist and naturalistic philosophies, which in the 1850s and 1860s were the more overriding perspectives. Yet it is nonetheless important to note that none of the mainstream British Idealists adopted the work of Kant, Fichte, Hegel or Lotze wholesale. Indeed, J. H. Muirhead contended in his Platonic Tradition in Anglo-Saxon Philosophy (1931) that British Idealism owed as much to an indigenous revival of Platonism, as it did to Kantianism and Hegelianism. However, the transcendental element in all such philosophical trends tended to function in large part as a generic antidote to the naturalism and empiricism of British philosophy.

In addition to the above philosophical influences, there was a range of issues and debates which also contributed to the rise and popularity of Idealism. For example, Idealism did respond very effectively to the social issues of the time. It was a philosophy that radiated optimism at a time of extreme social dislocation and pessimism concerning the appalling social and industrial conditions of the age. It offered a philosophy and a form of sophisticated understanding of political practice that gave a much needed emphasis to social cohesiveness and to the closeness of the relation between individual and collective responsibility. Its highlighting particularly of the importance of active social citizenship subsequently became an important theme in the early twentieth-century politics of welfare. In this sense many aspects of its output became associated, in some interpretations, with the development of a new social liberalism in the period from 1906 to 1914. It also attempted a bridging of philosophy and practice, something that was particularly evident in the work and life of Green. Green indeed acted as an initial powerful stimulus on the Idealist school in the domain of moral, social and political philosophy. He was often seen, therefore, to have had a significant effect on generations of students, including many academics, churchmen, politicians and public servants, for example, men such as Herbert Asquith, Edward Grey, Alfred Milner, Arthur Acland, A. C. Bradley, Arnold Toynbee, Bernard Bosanquet, R. L. Nettleship, J. H. Muirhead, Charles Gore and Henry Scott Holland.

Further, Idealism provided a philosophically important set of answers to questions (of the time) concerning the decline of religion in the face of positivistic science. One of the more noteworthy dimensions of this Idealist response to science -- which can look strange to some modern eyes -- is the way it engaged extensively and systematically with evolutionary theory. It did not reject it, but modified and integrated it in a sophisticated manner into its own philosophical arguments. Most of the key Idealists -- Green, Bradley, Caird, Bosanquet, Ritchie, Jones, Seth Pringle-Pattison -- wrote on evolution and engaged with the more mainstream evolutionary advocates. British Idealism thus acted as a profound metaphysical and practical interrogation, critique and metaphysical counterbalance to the prevailing doctrines of individualism, as well as the variants of an instinctive British utilitarianism and naturalistic evolutionism. In this sense, Idealism was, in much of its output, a 'working philosophy' which, certainly for a significant moment in British cultural history, set the course of moral and political thinking and delivered a resounding, if nonetheless temporary, refutation of the utilitarian, naturalistic and empiricist ethos.

One key point, which is clearly and effectively demonstrated in Mander's book (something which has also been noted forcefully by a number of other current scholars of British Idealism), is the sheer range of interest and internal intellectual diversity of the movement. In terms of the philosophers themselves, a rough and ready division can be made between three generations of Idealist philosophers. The first and most prestigious early members of the school were Green, Bradley and Edward Caird. The second generation incorporated students, initially of Green and Caird, such as Bosanquet, D.G. Ritchie, Henry Jones, Muirhead, and J.S Mackenzie. Both Glasgow and Oxford Universities were the main centres of such study. At Cambridge, McTaggart was probably the best known Idealist, although his work is different and idiosyncratic in texture and some have classed him as a Personal Idealist. Some of this second generation of students went abroad, such as John Watson (Canada) or Hoernlé (South Africa). There was also a widespread impact in both Australia and India. In the USA there were significant Idealist philosophers in the early twentieth century, such as Josiah Royce and Brand Blanshard, who frequently interacted with the British movement.

Another point to bear in mind here is that the movement bifurcated during this second phase. The most significant division was between the Absolute and Personal Idealists (more on this in a moment). The third and final phase, from the 1930s, saw a relative decline. In the 1920s the older generation (Bosanquet, Bradley, Jones, Caird) died. Philosophy departments, had already begun to absorb slowly the newer philosophical doctrines. A gradual 'sociology of philosophy' began to take effect in terms of appointments to key chairs in philosophy and a subtle gate-keeping exercise on teaching, journals and book publications. All this began to gradually affect the way philosophy was perceived from the 1930s. Michel Foucault would no doubt have much to say on this whole understated process. This was, though, by no means the end of Idealism as a philosophical movement, as Mander makes very clear. Many of the central philosophical themes were still carried through in the work of, for example, R.G. Collingwood, Michael Oakeshott, C.A. Campbell, H.H. Joachim, J.A. Smith, H.J. Paton and A.E. Taylor. Some would see the work of T.L.S. Sprigge and Leslie Amour as still making substantive contributions to the Idealist tradition in the 1990s and 2000s.

In the main, though, mainstream philosophy departments in Britain, from the 1940s, took little or no regard for Idealism as a philosophical perspective. Those few philosophers who expressed an interest were regarded as weird mavericks. This was largely the situation up to the mid-1990s and early 2000s, when a number of younger scholars began, once again, to investigate British Idealism as a serious moment in the development of British philosophy. Some of this interest may have initially derived from a reinvigoration of Hegel studies in Britain from the early 1980s. Mander's present work thus became (in his own terms) both possible and could be considered valuable in its own right. I would still argue though that this interest, at present in 2012, is more often than not to be found amongst political and moral philosophers, rather than epistemologists, metaphysicians or logicians. In the main, philosophy departments in Britain still remain in thrall to their own unquestioned founding myths.

In terms of internal philosophical diversity -- which as indicated is well covered in Mander's text -- there were also marked differences of philosophical emphasis within the various generations. Thus, to slot Green, Caird and Bradley into one category is plainly ludicrous. Idealism was clearly not one thing. It rather represented a composite body of philosophical views. If anything, Green was often seen by his contemporaries -- including both sympathetic readers such as Caird and critics such as A.J. Balfour -- to be much closer to Kant in his moral and metaphysical writings; although it was a Kant largely without the thing-in-itself. Green was also noted for his scepticism of Hegel (as indeed was Bradley). Many Idealists, in fact, such as Green, Bosanquet and Bradley, expressed a much stronger interest in Lotze's work. For Edward Caird, though, a much purer or more undiluted doctrine of mainstream Hegelianism prevailed (even more so in his brother John Caird); nonetheless Edward Caird wrote a long and powerfully argued two volume work on Kant's critical philosophy, where Kant unexpectedly becomes almost more Hegelian than Hegel. Bradley, on the other hand, although fairly sparing in any overt criticism of his British Idealist contemporaries, nonetheless developed a highly unique, yet deeply puzzling and excoriating (for many Idealist contemporaries) critique of thought, set against his elusive doctrine of 'immediate experience', in Appearance and Reality (1893).

By the later 1890s and early 1900s, younger members of the Idealist school began to divide up into factions. The key binary (although it is still a marked simplification) was between Absolute Idealists (Caird, Bradley and Bosanquet) and Personal Idealists (Andrew Seth Pringle Pattison, C.C.J. Webb, Hastings Rashdall, Boyce-Gibson, Henry Sturt and McTaggart). Absolute idealism, because it tried largely to characterise the totality of experience, was indicted for a multitude of crimes. It was accused of losing God in man, or man in God; dissolving things into thought; matter into spirit; abolishing all right and wrong; and truth and error. Its comprehensiveness and inclusivity was a virtue for some, but it was also the source of major problems for others. Idealist and non-Idealist critics alike were concerned largely about the idea of a unity above and beyond the individuals who comprised it, and which had a will of its own. This doctrine of the Absolute can also be found, to a degree, in Green's problematic idea of the eternal consciousness, as well as in Hegel's notion of Geist. What role God has in relation to these terms remained a divisive and unresolved issue, even among the more Absolutist-inclined thinkers. The metaphysical, moral and political danger of a diminution of the individual and subordination to a 'higher' entity was connected by some critics, such as L.T. Hobhouse, to both German militarism and the conflict of the First World War. These critics of Idealism became known as the Personal Idealists. Amongst them, though, there was -- as amongst the Absolute Idealists -- a good deal of internal diversity of opinions. The Absolute / Personalist debate is most vividly illustrated in a meeting of the Aristotelian Society in July 1918 entitled 'Do individuals possess a substantive or adjectival mode of being?'

In 1883 -- the year after the death of Green -- the aim and purpose of British Idealism did crystallise into a common endeavour, at least for a moment; thereafter it developed in a number of directions, including (it should be emphasised) the overt rejection and modification of Hegel. That year saw the publication of a kind of manifesto work: the Essays in Philosophical Criticism. The editors were R.B. Haldane and Andrew Seth (later Seth Pringle-Pattison and a keen advocate of Personal Idealism). The volume was dedicated, in a strongly symbolic way, to Green, whose Prolegomena to Ethics had been published posthumously in the same year, contemporaneous with Bradley's Principles of Logic. Both Green and Bradley, in effect, did prepare the way for the development of Idealism to become the dominant philosophy in the English-speaking world in the latter part of the nineteenth century. As indicated, Green had published his introduction to Hume in 1874; this latter work cleared the philosophical ground for the reception of Kant's and ultimately Hegel's and Lotze's work. Bradley had also published his ground-breaking Ethical Studies (1876) in which he attempted to transcend the limited conceptions of ethics associated with both utilitarianism and Kantianism. In many ways these works -- Green's Prologemena to Ethics, Bradley's Ethical Studies and Principles of Logic -- together formed part of the initial bedrock of the school. Thereafter, though, issues became more contested.

In summary, Mander provides us with a big book (605 pages) and a substantial read. The book provides the first really comprehensive and systematic overview of the British Idealist movement to date. There are a number of immensely valuable studies of individual Idealist philosophers by other recent scholars (over the last twenty years), as well as some excellent accounts of particular aspects of the British Idealist movement; however, Mander does give us an authoritative and immensely detailed synopsis of the movement as a whole, including, for any potential research students, a splendid biographical resource. Mander thus sketches in the background and historical development of British Idealism, its historical focus and interests, its detailed substantive debates over metaphysics, the philosophy of religion, ethics, political philosophy and, significantly, some of the detailed discussions of logic. Logic is one of the interesting and yet most misunderstood dimensions of the Idealists’ work, and Mander provides a full and clear rendition of their core ideas set against more recent understanding of logic in the later twentieth century. He also provides pithy short summaries of some other less well-known dimensions of Idealists' philosophical output, namely, their contributions to the understanding of aesthetics, the study of poetry and literature, educational theory and international relations. There are also later chapters which give fairly concise surveys of the way Idealist logic, politics, ethics, ideas on religion, etc. developed into the later twentieth century.

One thing to bear in mind with this book -- which it declares in its title -- is that it is a history of the movement. It is a welcome and extremely well-done history, but it is still a history of their ideas. There are moments when Mander does philosophically face down the later critics and shows us the way ideas have been miscast and misunderstood. But this counter-critique of the analytic movement forms only a small component of the book. Overall, it is a welcome work of painstaking scholarship and it provides a valuable and detailed corrective to the way British philosophy has constructed its own historical self-image in the later twentieth century.