Burdened Virtues: Virtue Ethics for Liberatory Struggles

Placeholder book cover

Lisa Tessman, Burdened Virtues: Virtue Ethics for Liberatory Struggles, Oxford University Press, 2005, 185pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195179153.

Reviewed by Macalester Bell, Columbia University


In this original and thought-provoking book, Lisa Tessman argues that Aristotelian virtue ethics has a unique and important role to play in understanding the ways in which oppression in general, and oppression of women in particular, harms the selves who must face and resist this oppression. As she sees it, oppression interferes with the ability of the oppressed to achieve moral goodness. Many feminist theorists have taken up the question of how we should resist oppression, but Tessman's focus on how resisting oppression can limit and burden the moral goodness of the oppressed sets her approach apart from other recent work on this topic. While the reader may not ultimately be convinced that a neo-Aristotelian framework provides the best way of conceptualizing the harms associated with oppression, Tessman's thoughtful analysis raises some very important issues that have not yet received adequate attention in the literature.

Tessman is attracted to a neo-Aristotelian account of virtue ethics because of its eudaimonism. She recognizes that Aristotle's own account of the polis was abhorrently exclusionary and thus an unlikely source for thinking about the harms associated with oppression. In response, she offers the following addendum to Aristotle's eudaimonistic theory: "…a trait that contributes to one's own well-being cannot count as morally praiseworthy if it detracts from the flourishing of an inclusive social collectivity."(7) Understood in this inclusive way, Tessman argues that Aristotelian virtue ethics provides a helpful way of thinking about the costs associated with oppression because it creates the theoretical space to inquire into the relationship between character traits and flourishing. Specifically, it allows us to consider whether the character traits that may be required to face and resist oppression might inhibit the agent's own flourishing. In this way, the Aristotelian framework helps us to understand the full extent of the deprivations created by oppressive conditions.

Tessman goes on to identify two forms of what she calls "moral trouble" that are widespread under circumstances of oppression. First, oppression may interfere with the flourishing of the oppressed by creating unfavorable circumstances that will, at least in some cases, prevent the oppressed from developing or exercising the virtues. Second, oppressive external conditions require the oppressed to develop a set of virtues that come with a moral cost to those who manifest these virtues. Tessman calls these traits the "burdened virtues." She writes: "What I think of as the burdened virtues include all those traits that make a contribution to human flourishing--if they succeed in doing so at all--only because they enable survival of or resistance to oppression (it is in this that their nobility lies), while in other ways they detract from their bearer's well-being, in some cases so deeply that their bearer may be said to lead a wretched life." (95)

In short, the traits that Tessman identifies as the burdened virtues are traits that allow one to endure and resist oppression, yet ultimately detract from the bearer's well-being. She goes on to argue that the existence of these virtues suggests that Aristotle's eudaimonism must be reevaluated: "…the concept of burdened virtues implies that eudaimonism must be rethought in certain ways, because contrary to the usual pattern of connection between a virtue and its bearer's flourishing, here is a set of virtues that could only actualize their potential to be partly constitutive of a flourishing life if the background conditions were different." (160)

Once we acknowledge that the connection between a virtue and its bearer's flourishing may be ruptured under conditions of oppression, how can we identify what traits ought to count as virtues? In an effort to answer this question, Tessman distinguishes between four types of character traits:

Trait V1: "tends to enable its bearer to make the right decisions and to perform good actions (given the assumption that these are available); and, having trait V1 is conducive to or partly constitutes living a good life." (162)

Trait V2: "when good actions are unavailable, trait V2 tends to enable its bearer to choose as well as possible, with the appropriate feelings, such as regret or anguish, toward what cannot be done. Furthermore, trait V2 is a trait that would be good--in the straightforward sense of conducive to or constitutive of flourishing--if conditions were better and presented a truly good option, for in such a case trait V2 would operate without the encumbrance of a moral remainder, and thus without the negative feelings that attach to it." (163)

Trait V3: "is chosen because it is judged to be the best trait to cultivate in the circumstances, even though it is not conducive to or constitutive of anyone's flourishing at present; it does, however, tend to enable its bearer to perform actions with the aim of eventually making flourishing lives more possible overall (for the bearer of trait V3 and/or for others)." (165)

Trait V4: "tends to enable its bearer to make the best possible decisions and to perform the best possible actions; and, having trait V4 is conductive to or partly constitutes living as well as possible, though because trait V4 carries a cost to its bearer (and perhaps to others), it is only choiceworthy when bad conditions are present and a good life is unattainable." (166)

Thus, the traits that fall under the category of V1 may be considered non-burdened virtues and the traits individuated by the categories V2-V4 may be considered burdened virtues.

Given this description of Tessman's framework, we might wonder how we ought to understand the account of flourishing that underlies her view. Unlike Aristotle, who understands flourishing via an account of the virtues, Tessman leaves open the possibility that we can (in some sense) understand the virtues via some conception of flourishing. And while she denies that we can identify the virtues associated with traits V3 and V4 simply by working backward from a concept of flourishing, it seems like a substantive concept of flourishing must play a central role in her account of the virtues. For it looks as though it is her account of flourishing that will allow us to individuate which traits ought to be considered virtues and what kind of virtues these traits will be. Given this, one might think that she would articulate and defend a substantive account of flourishing. But rather than appealing to a specific account of flourishing, Tessman adopts what she describes as a "general conception of flourishing…implicit in the goals of liberatory movements (such as feminist movements and movements for racial liberation)." (51) In defense of this methodology, she claims that her framework does not require a specific account of human flourishing. Or, as she puts it, her framework does not need an articulated account of human flourishing any more than any act of social change needs an articulated account of human flourishing. Tessman takes herself to be committed to the implicit ideas about human flourishing that can be found in the goals of liberatory groups, and nothing beyond these implicit ideas about flourishing.

But if all liberatory groups implicitly rely on some notion of flourishing, why not articulate, at least in broad strokes, the actual content of this conception (or conceptions) of flourishing? It seems to me that this would be a very difficult task. In so far as liberatory political groups have an implicit notion of flourishing at all, their conceptions of flourishing will often diverge from one another. Take for example the notions of flourishing implicit in the political goals and activities of feminists who identify as lesbian separatists and those who identify as liberal feminists. Clearly these two groups have very different notions of what it means to flourish. Given the distinct accounts of flourishing that can be found in different liberatory movements, it would have been helpful if Tessman had articulated the main tenets of the conception of flourishing she favors.

Tessman's failure to articulate a specific account of human flourishing may explain why it is difficult to determine which traits of character ought to be considered virtues and which traits of character ought to be considered vices on her account. At one point in the book, she lists cruelty, indifference, contempt, arrogance, callousness, greed, self-centeredness, dishonesty, cowardice and injustice as vices (54-55), but it is not obvious that these traits ought to count as vices according to her four-fold classification of the virtues. In fact, it looks as though many of these putative vices will come out as burdened virtues on her account. Consider, for example, the putative vice of arrogance. Presumably, arrogance could be classified as a V3 or V4 trait: if women must live under oppressive conditions in which they are regularly demeaned, adopting an attitude of arrogance would tend to enable these women to perform certain actions that are partially constitutive of a good life or which might increase their opportunities for flourishing in the future. For example, an arrogant person will be more likely to demand respect from others as compared to a person who is not arrogant. Arguably, a person who demands respect for herself is living a better life than one who does not and it seems plausible that such a person would act in ways that would bring about the possibility for greater flourishing in the future. I take it that similar sorts of considerations could be marshaled in support of many of the other vices on Tessman's list. Indeed, given Tessman's description, almost any trait could count as a V3 or V4 trait. Thus, if we accept Tessman's analysis, it is hard to see how we could draw a sharp distinction between the virtues and the vices.

In fairness, it should be emphasized that, as Tessman sees it, not all traits individuated by this four-fold classification ought to count as burdened or non-burdened virtues. Instead, some instances of these traits will count as virtues, and others will not. She writes: "The idea of a burden attached to a trait is that there is some level of cost that is to be weighed against what is otherwise excellent about the trait. But somewhere on this continuum, a burden becomes so great that it no longer makes sense to assess the trait as good…" (166) Thus, an overly burdened virtue will, in fact, be no virtue at all. But keeping this qualification in mind, it still seems that many of the vices that Tessman individuates will, in the end, count as burdened virtues on her account. To return to the example of arrogance, a case could be made that adopting an arrogant attitude can serve to shore up a shaky sense of self-respect and in so doing may help the arrogant individual eventually flourish. While there may well be high burdens associated with arrogance, it seems unlikely that these burdens would be so high that we would no longer be justified in considering arrogance a burdened virtue.

In the end, whether or not a particular trait ought to be classified as a virtue will depend upon whether or not the burdens associated with the trait are so great as to call into question its goodness. But if this is how we ought to determine whether or not a particular trait is a virtue, it becomes unclear what theoretical work Tessman's commitment to a neo-Aristotelian framework is doing. For it looks as though we can decide whether or not a given trait is a burdened virtue by performing a simple cost-benefit analysis on the trait in question. And if this is right, it is difficult to understand what is distinctly Aristotelian or neo-Aristotelian about Tessman's account.

To get a clearer sense of what Tessman's neo-Aristotelian approach adds to existing feminist discourse on resisting oppression, it may be helpful to look at one burdened virtue in particular: anger. Anger is a V3 trait, that is, it is a trait that it may be good to cultivate (even though it is not constitutive of anyone's flourishing at present) because it tends to enable its bearer to perform actions that will eventually lead to increased flourishing overall. While anger can be experienced as a discrete emotion, Tessman is interested in evaluating anger as a character trait.

The character trait of what we might call "oppositional anger" (i.e., a disposition to feel anger toward oppressors) is sometimes a virtue because of the positive role it can play in resisting oppression and oppressors. As Tessman notes, feminists have been discussing the positive value of anger for many years and four defenses of anger can be found in the literature. First, some feminists see anger as a way of resisting sexist norms and constraints. Within contexts of oppression, to feel anger at oppressors or oppressive institutions is a way of resisting this oppression and maintaining one's self-respect. Second, some feminists stress the direct and indirect epistemological value of anger. Anger may have direct epistemological import insofar as an individual's anger towards oppressive institutions and practices gives her direct knowledge of the costs of oppression. Those who stress the indirect epistemological import of anger argue that the oppressed can learn a great deal about their status by attending to the circumstances in which their anger is (and is not) given uptake (i.e., taken seriously as anger) by others. Third, some theorists have argued that anger towards oppressors and oppressive institutions ought to count as moral achievement because the anger of political resistance is a way of bearing witness to injustice. Finally, some have argued that anger can be morally and politically valuable insofar as it helps to motivate social change.

Tessman recognizes that anger toward oppressors and oppressive institutions and practices may have important roles to play in resisting oppression. But she suggests that feminist discussions of anger have not paid adequate attention to the terrible costs of this type of oppositional anger. After citing Aristotle's well known claim that anger can be praiseworthy so long as it is directed "at the right things and with the right people, and further, as he ought, when he ought, and as long as he ought," (120) Tessman argues that oppositional anger can become burdened in two ways: it may be directed toward an inappropriate target or it may become excessive.

Under conditions of oppression, it is likely that the anger of the oppressed will become burdened along these two dimensions. First, the oppressed will find it difficult to properly target their anger. Targeting anger well requires a great deal of strength, courage and self-knowledge and these traits will be difficult to develop if one is oppressed. While it may be difficult to direct one's anger toward the right target under circumstances of oppression, Tessman suggests that it may be impossible for the oppressed not to experience "excessive" anger toward their oppressors. Given that oppressed individuals experience daily degradation, they will often experience intense anger toward their oppressors. Thus, relative to the appropriate level of anger for the non-oppressed, the proper level of anger for the political resister becomes extreme: "If tremendous anger is ultimately unhealthy or corrosive for its bearer, then the political resister with an angry disposition displays an example of what I have been calling a burdened virtue… if one chooses to be angered only in a measured way, then one must endure the degradation of oneself or of others on whose behalf one acts, but if one chooses to develop a fully angered/enraged disposition in response to the vast injustice one is fighting, then the anger can become consuming." (124-5) So, while Tessman acknowledges that there may be a role for oppositional anger in overcoming oppression, she insists that we must recognize the costs associated with this anger. Specifically, she argues that we ought to regret the negative effects that this type of anger may have on its bearer and others within the moral community.

Tessman's conclusion here depends upon her assumption that tremendous anger is unhealthy and corrosive. Unfortunately, she does not offer an argument in support of this claim or much by way of an explanation of it. In what ways is oppositional anger unhealthy and what exactly does it corrode? Given the important role this assumption plays in her overarching argument, Tessman's case would have been strengthened if she had defended this claim in a bit more detail.

After endorsing anger as a burdened virtue Tessman writes: "But the endorsement must be accompanied by regrets, primarily regrets about what the anger does to its bearer (but also worries about what the angry self may do to others)" (130). Even if we were to accept Tessman's claims about the costs associated with oppositional anger, why think that the appropriate attitude that one must take up in this situation is one of regret? Further, who exactly ought to feel regret? Should the bearer of the oppositional anger feel regret or those of us who evaluate her character? On the following page Tessman writes: "There should be no glory in resistance to injustice, just a sad and regretful recognition of its necessity." (131) This clearly suggests that it is the bearer of oppositional anger who ought to regret the corrosive effects of her anger, but why think that those who respond to oppression with anger ought to feel regret? Tessman seems to have been influenced here by a certain strand of thought found in the literature on moral dilemmas. Several theorists have claimed that when a virtuous agent is faced with a genuine moral dilemma, she will perform the best possible action under the circumstances but will do so with a feeling of intense pain and regret. It is the agent's pain and regret that mark her as genuinely virtuous. Since Tessman views oppositional anger as terribly corrosive, she conceptualizes the chronically angry person as having decided to take the best possible course of action (i.e., adopting the attitude of anger) given the constraints of the situation (i.e., under the circumstances of oppression in which adopting an attitude of anger is preferable to forgoing the anger). In such a situation, Tessman argues, the genuinely virtuous person will regret, not embrace, her anger.

She does not acknowledge it, but Tessman's claim that the chronically angry ought to regret their anger fundamentally undermines many of the feminist defenses of anger found in the literature. As we have seen, some feminists have argued that anger is a praiseworthy emotion because it is a way of resisting the degradation of oppression and thus helps women to maintain their self-respect. But if women should regret, rather than embrace, their anger, it is not at all clear how anger will provide women with a way of standing against oppression. Being burdened with a trait you regret seems more likely to threaten, rather than boost, one's self-respect. Additionally, it is hard to see how the anger-regret combination will be motivationally efficacious. Anger has a tendency to promote direct confrontation with the object of anger and this confrontation can lead to social change. The action tendency of regret, on the other hand, does not motivate one to confront the object of regret. After all, the object of regret is usually a state of affairs, rather than a person. Thus, it is not at all clear how the anger-regret that Tessman advocates would be able to motivate social progress. In short, I think that Tessman's view has important ramifications that she has yet to fully explore. If she is right, and oppositional anger ought to be accompanied by regret, then we should consider how an agent's regret and anger would interact with each other. I have suggested that the combination of anger and regret would undermine at least some of the ameliorative functions of anger that previous feminist theorists have stressed.

What then does Tessman's appeal to the neo-Aristotelian virtue framework add to the existing feminist debate concerning the moral and political value of anger? It is not altogether clear. Tessman goes to great lengths to emphasize what she sees as the dangers associated with oppositional anger, but this does not set her apart from many other feminists working in this area. Nonetheless, her account is unique in stressing the ways in which being oppressed limits and places great burdens on the moral goodness of the selves that must endure and resist oppression. Moreover, if Tessman's arguments prove successful, her account would challenge many of the feminist defenses of anger found in the literature.