Camus, Philosophe: To Return to Our Beginnings

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Matthew Sharpe, Camus, Philosophe: To Return to Our Beginnings, Brill, 2015, 446pp., $194.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789004302334.

Reviewed by David Stegall, Clemson University


Matthew Sharpe begins with the celebratory confession that "Camus' voice has been so much a part of my inner life, like many millions of others', that I don't know where my own sensibilities begin that were not taken from what I took to be his." (xiii) Sharpe situates his text within the ongoing Camus renaissance, a renaissance that Sharpe traces to four causes: The publication in 1994 of Camus' Le Premier Homme, a true literary event; the fall of Stalinism; the war on terror; and the decline of the hegemony of post-modernism and post-structuralism with academia. And so while Camus had never declined in popularity as a writer, Camus as philosopher and as resource for philosophical inquiry has been on the rise since the 1990s. This renaissance arguably goes beyond the sources cited by Sharpe and should also include recent texts such as Elizabeth Hawes' Camus: A Romance, and Kamel Daoud's The Meursault Investigation [the latter published to near universal acclaim, although a Muslim cleric issued a fatwa encouraging people to kill Daoud]. And as Sharpe reminds us, an additional 'fifth spur' to Camus scholarship was that 2013 marked the centennial of Camus' birth and occasioned several conferences and texts. In tracing and being a part of said renaissance, Sharpe produces an exhaustive survey of the recent secondary literature on Camus, heavily footnoted and annotated.

Sharpe has a two-fold goal. His first four chapters are "devoted to showing [that] Camus anticipates many of the epistemic, ontological and political claims of later 'post-structuralist' theorizing." (16) Sharpe is combating the trend where "Critics vie with each other to dismiss Camus' pretensions to the august title of 'philosophe', as against a gifted 'litterateur'". (4) To accomplish this first goal, Sharpe  is essentially using the old saw of T.S. Eliot that "each writer creates his precursors" [i.e. Having read Kafka, one can then see the Kafkaesque in a scene from Shakespeare or Cervantes]. For Sharpe, this will mean that having read Lyotard, Foucault, Derrida and Levinas, one can see some of these philosophers' key ideas to be nascent or 'anticipated' by Camus. This rereading of Camus in light of later themes in Continental thought is a part of Sharpe's goal of making the case for Camus as philosophe. To further this first goal, Sharpe offers several extremely helpful diagrammatic presentations of key arguments and themes in Camus; Sharpe thereby frees the 'analytic backbone' of Camus' thought from Camus' lyrical style of writing. Specifically, he diagrams Camus' notion of "mesure", as employed by Camus in philosophy, art and politics; diagrams the argument of The Rebel in 40 premises; diagrams what Sharpe refers to as Camus' master argument, as it appears in "Letters to a German Friend" and The Rebel; diagrams Camus's literary cycles of the Absurd, Rebellion, etc., as presented in differing genres; and makes a final point by point comparison of Hellenism with Christianity. Any instructor using Camus in the classroom will find these diagrams to be invaluable teaching aids [as will their students!]. While pursuing this first goal, Sharpe will stress that Camus cannot be absorbed into these other thinkers, for Camus resists a "totalizing pessimism" and instead defends "the political values of liberty and social justice" (17). Camus warns against the temptations of skepticism and cynicism, be they directed at reason's powers, at the search for meaning, or at political struggles against suffering and injustice.

To achieve this first goal, Sharpe will, in sum, put

Camus into dialogue with Foucault [on power], . . . [with] the Frankfurt School concerning disciplinary and instrumental rationality and totalitarianism; . . . [with] Hans Blumenberg's work, and debates concerning the 'legitimacy of modernity'; . . . [with] Derrida's post-Heideggerian deconstruction of Western metaphysics; then [with] Levinas' and Habermas' dialogic forms of ethics (55).

While this first goal, the argument for respecting Camus as philosopher, does have a sort of honor within it, a 'speaking for the dead' as it were, it is frankly a mere prelude. It is Sharpe's second goal that marks the deeper relevance of this text. He situates Camus's robust work as being akin to and a realization of Pierre Hadot's hopes for Philosophy, as presented by Hadot in, e.g.,  Philosophy as a Way of Life and What is Ancient Philosophy? Sharpe expresses this second goal thusly:

It is this other dimension in Camus, contesting or 'balancing' all historicisms' partial, exclusive emphases on our determination by cultural, linguistic, political or institutional forces that remains Camus' most original contribution to 20th century French thought . . . . Camus' species of contemplative naturalism (paralleled in 20th century French philosophy perhaps only by Pierre Hadot) is arguably his most prescient contribution to contemporary thought. (256)

Reminding his audience that Camus "never aimed even his most theoretical works solely or primarily at a scholarly, academic audience" (19), Sharpe is emphasizing that Camus comes to his themes thru his own pain and moral outrage and writes his convictions for the human community, not the academy. Here one can reflect upon Camus' biography -- born into poverty, with no exemplars of the life of the mind, as contrasted with Sartre's Les Mots, Sartre's remembered childhood as being a life in a library, surrounded by the expectation that he too must add to that library. And also, Camus himself notes that "I got my first philosophical impressions from the Greeks, not from nineteenth century Germany" (29).

This emphasis by Camus, that his touchstone was a version of 'the Mediterranean', 'Ancient Greek', or at times 'Algerian' way of life and way of thought, [again akin to Hadot] is perhaps a good moment to discuss another trope in Sharpe's text. Sharpe begins Camus, Philosophe, with a quote from Camus' essay "The Enigma". This quote reads in part, that

Paris is a glittering cave, and its inhabitants, seeing their own shadows reflected on the far wall, take them to be the only reality there is . . . . But, far from Paris, . . . . There is a light behind us, that we must turn around and cast off our chains in order to face it directly, and that our task . . . is to seek through words to identify it (viii).

Sharpe wants Plato's allegory of the cave to be one organizing theme for his text. The Western story can be read as having once been outside the cave, in the harsh but invigorating light of Ancient Greek thought. We have come to now be cave dwellers, due to Christianity, and Camus [and Hadot] offer us a way to reclaim a world that we once understood and flourished within. Thus we have Sharpe's subtitle "To Return to Our Beginnings", a hope of both Hadot and Camus.

And so, it is what Camus can do for philosophy, rather than what philosophers can do for Camus, that is the real message of Sharpe's text. A reader of Hadot can often come away from Hadot with a sense that Hadot is showing us a forever lost Golden Age of Philosophy, when "to be a philosopher in classical antiquity, from the pre-Socratics to the later Imperial period, was a very different thing than to be an academic philosopher in the recognized senses of this term today" (32). Thought and discussion, rather than writing, a way of life and of ongoing practice, seems now lost and irretrievable. But Camus is presented by Sharpe as a practitioner of what Hadot eulogized. Sharpe compares Camus' journals and journaling to Marcus Aurelius' Meditations, a daily effort at mindfulness and self- cultivation, "a mind watching itself" (35). Camus' powers as playwright, nature essayist, and novelist are a spontaneous refusal to play the elitist within language and audience. Sharpe characterizes this as Camus' "refusal of the hard-and-fast separation between heart and mind, reason and the passions." (36) Camus' return to the Greeks is not via philology [ala Nietzsche] or academia [ala Heidegger], but is the expressing of the life he had already been born into, as a child of the sea and the sun, an Algerian. As Sharpe stresses,"at its origin, Camus' philosophy is a lived philosophy" (269). And even in its most analytic moments, "Camus' concern [is] with the Socratic question of how to live, and his own attempt to live an examined life, and assist others in their like attempts to live well". (331)

There is more one could add in characterizing Sharpe's efforts in this study of Camus. Sharpe is exceptionally sound in his explication of The Fall and Camus' play "State of Siege". And Sharpe pays far more attention to Camus' writings on Nature than have most commentators. Sharpe astutely sees Camus as at times a victim of his own gifts -- like an actress so beautiful that her beauty makes none able to see her acting talent, the effortless lyricism of Camus' prose makes him appear an intellectual lightweight, as if style can only be for the sake of hiding a lack of substance. For the more cynical among us, Sharpe helpfully identifies Camus's well-springs, that "the vital human capacities for shared joy, wonder, love, friendship, solidarity and beauty do not depend on peoples' possessing a shared, totalizing metaphysics" (103), along with the human power of artistic creation, and the call of natural beauty, the solace and solitude of the desert, the sea, the wind. And for those of us who cleave to Camus as a moral guide, Sharpe correctly stresses Camus' axiom that "human beings have an inalienable right to resist all forms of evil or the imposition of innocent, useless suffering," (113), and that "in killing others, we violate and betray what is best in ourselves, and compromise whatever causes we serve, however otherwise just" (227).

Sharpe ends with a sympathetically sketch of the twilight period of Camus, Camus' inner agony as his Algeria spirals into civil war in the 1950s, and Camus' final, tentative rebirth, as he uses Le Premier Homme as an exploration of his own love for and memory of Algeria. Sharpe writes that Le Premier Homme

allowed Camus to revisit his own personal and spiritual origins . . . it allowed him to try to return to the original, unprepossessing sources of the core virtues that emerge throughout his life's work: a predogmatic human solidarity, friendship, admiration, and a love of life not yet caught up in the joyless pursuits of conquest, status, power and fame. (389).

In sum, Sharpe makes a strong argument for the continuing vitality of Camus' thought, that his is a well-deserved renaissance. Sharpe's text would be a useful addition to any undergraduate or graduate library as a superb summary of current Camus scholarship and trends. And to end on the theme of renaissance, let us allow Camus to have the last word, an honor he certainly earned. "In the midst of winter, I found there was, within me, an invincible summer".