Carnap, Tarski, and Quine at Harvard: Conversations on Logic, Mathematics, and Science

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Greg Frost-Arnold, Carnap, Tarski, and Quine at Harvard: Conversations on Logic, Mathematics, and Science, Open Court, 2013, 257pp, $49.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780812698305.

Reviewed by Richard Creath, Arizona State University


In 1940-41, Carnap, Tarski, and Quine met at Harvard over many months for intense discussions. These giants of analytic philosophy probed their different understandings of language and the differences they saw among logic, mathematics, and science. It would have been amazing to have been there as a fly on the wall. Now, thanks to this excellent book, we can be. This is because Carnap took extensive shorthand notes on the conversations, and because Frost-Arnold has edited and translated those notes so that we have them here in both German and English. That by itself would have been a major contribution to our historical understanding of twentieth century analytic philosophy. But Frost-Arnold gives us much more. A bit more than the first half of the volume is a thoughtful essay that illuminates the various issues under discussion and sets them in the context of the evolving views of the three participants. Where the book particularly shines is in connecting these ideas of 1940-41 with our ongoing philosophical concerns today. The result is a book that will be of major interest to historians and to current philosophers, whether the latter think they have historical interests or not.

It is hard to know if Carnap's notes precisely captured the various views expressed. What little independent evidence there is seems to corroborate them, but perhaps the strongest evidence is internal. The notes attribute to both Tarski and Quine subtle and powerful views that certainly seem to be "living thoughts" rather than caricatures. Of course, that argument goes only so far, but it will have to do.

Carnap's notes cover a wide range of complex issues. Because they are conversations rather than finished works, the participants can try out ideas and revise them as the argument warranted. For reasons of space I will touch on only three of those issues here: the finitism/nominalism project, the analytic/synthetic distinction, and the unity of science.

Frost-Arnold says that the prime mover of the finitist/nominalist project seems to have been Tarski, though joined by Quine. Carnap resisted the demands, though he took an active part in the discussions. The project's central theses received a number of formulations that were by no means equivalent, and these theses were justified in various ways. The project was to formulate certain demands on the language of science and defend them with the ultimate aim of constructing a language that meets these demands. The demands are roughly that the universe of discourse should contain only finitely many entities and these should all be concrete, that is, physical objects. On a more liberal version, the language choice should not rule out the possibility either that there are only finitely many objects or that these are physical objects.

These demands were variously defended by alleging (1) that non-finitist languages were inherently not understandable, (2) that appeals to infinite domains, to abstracta, and the use of higher-order logics are all dangerously metaphysical, (3) that violating finitist/nominalist strictures is epistemically risky, and (4) that perhaps our universe contains only finitely many physical objects or even only finitely many spatio-temporal positions, so we should not adopt any language that rules this out in advance.

I have to admit that I do not find any version of the demands or the defenses of them at all compelling. (I find some of what Carnap says in resisting the demands equally puzzling.) But this is not the place to argue against either the demands or the justifications for them. Happily, Frost-Arnold brings a wide knowledge of what Tarski, Quine, and Carnap have written elsewhere and is able to tie the various bits together so that they illuminate each other. We come to see that these issues really do bear on the problems we care about now, even if there is much left to be learned.

If all entities are physical objects and there might be at most a finite number of those, then the mathematics we construct would seem to be synthetic. For example, if there are numbers at all, there would be a largest prime number, but what that number is could be learned only empirically. In any case, issues surrounding analyticity were raised directly in the Harvard discussions. Quine certainly remembers himself as having challenged Carnap forcefully. But as Frost-Arnold says, "Interestingly, the discussant who manifests the most sustained and direct animosity toward analyticity is not Quine but Tarski." (p. 74) Quine later said of the six years preceding these discussions that he "was very much Carnap's disciple" (cited on p. 83). So the Harvard conversations provide a unique window on the development of Quine's ideas just as he was emerging from discipleship. Frost-Arnold reviews the arguments of the notes with great care but also weaves these issues into a much larger story of the long term development of both Carnap's and Quine's conceptions of the issues.

Not all of the larger story can be either summarized here or responded to, but since Frost-Arnold deals at length with some ideas I've had that have been discussed in the literature, perhaps I can comment on that. Some years ago (Creath, 1990) I suggested that Quine's final, radical break with analyticity came at the end of a triangular correspondence with Morton White and Nelson Goodman (in White, 1999, 337-57). Of course, he had long before set himself on a course that would have this outcome, and from at least the 1940-41 discussions he had raised vigorous objections to Carnap's way of proceeding. But the evidence from the forties is equivocal. A change of this magnitude is unlikely to happen all at one moment, and one's attitudes on such issues are likely to be complex.

Paolo Mancosu challenged this timeline (2005), saying that Quine had explicitly raised arguments against analyticity in the 1940-41 discussions and by the time of a 1942 letter to J. H. Woodger (quoted p. 114) had considered that rejection to have already been in "Truth by Convention" of 1936. Mancosu's paper is excellent, and one should certainly not minimize the evidence it brings forward.

Frost-Arnold appreciates all this and tries to find a tertium quid between Mancuso's position and mine. In this I think he largely succeeds. First, he recognizes that the situation is complex and the evidence pulls in both directions. There is the letter to Woodger of 1942 in which Quine pretty baldly states that the "cleavage between the analytic and synthetic is an empty phrase" (p. 114). But there is a lecture of 1946 that discusses the explication of 'analytic' where Quine says "my attitude is not one of defeatism, nor one of dismissing the problems as illusory. We have real problems here, meaningful problems worth working on." (quoted on p. 115). I would add that there is also, at the outset of the triangular correspondence of 1947, a certain hesitancy on Quine's part. Indeed, he sometimes seems the most reluctant of the three to abandon all hope of clarifying the notion of analyticity. At the end of the correspondence and thereafter this hesitancy seems entirely gone.

Second, Frost-Arnold distinguishes sharply between "Carnap's a priori, modal, and semantic characterization" (p. 115) of analyticity and Quine's desired explication "along empirical, extensional, and hopefully syntactic lines" (p. 115). On Frost-Arnold's view, Quine had rejected the former early, by 1942 at the latest, but was not willing to reject the possibility of the latter till shortly before he wrote "Two Dogmas", a period that would presumably include the end of the triangular correspondence.

While I think that beliefs and timelines on such issues are seldom this tidy, I think this does yield the desired tertium quid. I should add, however, that there is an important connection between Quine's hope for an empirical explication of analyticity and the force of his argument against Carnap's more a priori approach. Carnap doesn't think that he needs to do anything more than lay down semantical rules in order to construct an artificial language with respect to which 'analytic' is adequately defined. This is because he conceives of himself as making proposals rather than as engaging in empirical linguistics. But Quine can rightly argue that unless there is some empirical notion of analyticity, or synonymy, or semantical rule, etc. there is no possibility of telling what it is to adopt a proposal or whether such adoption is in fact pragmatically useful. If Quine could prove that there could be no adequate empirical explication, he could seal the case against Carnap's a priori methods. Quine offers no such proof.[1] But in giving up on the search for an empirical account Quine is simultaneously giving up altogether on the possibility of salvaging Carnap's approach.

The last chapter, of Frost-Arnold's book is "Overcoming Metaphysics through the Unity of Science". Here the idea is to pull the various themes together into a larger whole, not only relating the themes of the 1940-41 discussions, but also putting them in the context of ongoing philosophic developments. All of the discussants had voiced anti-metaphysical sentiments at Harvard, so this is the focus of the chapter. Since Carnap and Otto Neurath are the philosophers most associated with an anti-metaphysical stance, Frost-Arnold concentrates on them. He traces Carnap's treatment of the issue from the Aufbau on through his later work. The core of Carnap's idea, according to the chapter, is that claims or concepts are non-metaphysical, i.e., intelligible, if and only if they can be incorporated into the unified language of science. Frost-Arnold shows how Carnap's exact account changes with the decades, but the general strategy does not. For Neurath the link between the anti-metaphysical stance and the unity of science is even closer. Indeed, it would seem to be virtually definitional identity. Is Frost-Arnold right that there is an important link between, say, a concept's being metaphysical and the impossibility of incorporating it into (the language of) unified science? In general terms, almost certainly. And it is illuminating too, but only up to a point. The linkage doesn't really tell us what a unification is or why that should matter. But Frost-Arnold does use the linkage to throw light on why Tarski and Quine might call infinitary or Platonistic concepts and claims metaphysical and unintelligible, namely, they cannot be incorporated into what they envision as the language of science. It goes unmentioned, but Carnap can also see Tarksi's and Quine's demands themselves, insofar as they violate the principle of tolerance, as metaphysical. In this their view is more like Carnap's own earlier dogmatic rejection of metaphysics.

Along the way Frost-Arnold touches on a number of interesting questions that it would be fascinating to pursue more fully than either he can in the chapter or than I can here. One example is a puzzle about why Carnap would say in the Aufbau that a philosophic attempt to "explain" a correlation between mental and physical events or statements is metaphysical. Does this mean that in the late twenties Carnap rejects the sort of account of explanation that Hempel and Oppenheim presented so beautifully in the late forties? No, I think it indicates that Carnap was using the word 'explain' in a different, but not idiosyncratic, way. But that would be a discussion for another day.

We can be grateful that Frost-Arnold's treatment of metaphysics avoids the trap that many contemporary philosophers fall into of thinking that Carnap's (and Neurath's) anti-metaphysical stance aims to sweep away the whole subject area of late twentieth century metaphysics along with all the work that is done under that heading. Carnap is concerned to ensure that philosophers not try to limit the concepts that scientists can employ and that philosophers not themselves engage in "wearisome controversies" that have no hope of resolution. But I don't think that most contemporary metaphysicians see themselves as antagonistic toward science or in any way restricting how science can go about its business. Moreover, many metaphysicians think of their enterprise as conceptual analysis or explication of a sort that Carnap could easily embrace. So when Frost-Arnold insists that what is central to the anti-metaphysical stance is the connection to the language of science, he is onto something revealing about what Carnap and Neurath are doing. And it is helpful to use this connection to tie together the various concerns that come out in the 1940-41 discussions at Harvard and tie those in turn to ongoing philosophic developments. Of course, there is more to say. There always is. But Frost-Arnold's book is a major contribution that will continue to inform the discussion for years to come.


Creath, R., (1990), "Introduction", Dear Carnap, Dear Van: The Quine-Carnap Correspondence and Related Work, (Berkeley: University of California Press), 1-43.

Mancosu, P., (2005), "Harvard 1940-41: Tarski, Carnap and Quine on a Finitistic Language of Mathematics for Science", History and Philosophy of Logic, 26:327-57.

White, M., (1999), A Philosopher's Story, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State Press.

[1] Quine himself offers an empirical criterion in Roots of Reference of 1974.  But he does not think that this notion will serve Carnap’s purposes, but it is at least an empirical criterion.