Catherine Villanueva Gardner, Empowerment and Interconnectivity: Toward a Feminist History of Utilitarian Philosophy

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Catherine Villanueva Gardner, Empowerment and Interconnectivity: Toward a Feminist History of Utilitarian Philosophy, Penn State University Press, 2013, 215pp., $28.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780271058153.

Reviewed by Anita M. Superson, University of Kentucky


This book attempts to show that several utilitarian thinkers, mostly women, are feminist philosophers, and that they have been ignored in traditional history of philosophy because their work does not fit squarely into traditional methodology and discourse, which Catharine Villanueva Gardner refers to as the "patrimonial" picture of philosophy. Gardner focuses on a small group of English and American utilitarians from the 19th century because she believes that utilitarianism and feminism match comfortably, given their emphasis on equal rights and education for women. (26) Throughout the book, however, she seems to place the reader on a sensitive teeter-totter, balancing between a nonessentialist view of feminism, according to which the aim of feminism is to end women's oppression, and an essentialist view, according to which women (and men) essentially have certain traits or characteristics and in order for philosophy to be feminist, it ought to accommodate or rely on these features. The latter view has, fortunately, gone out of fashion in feminist philosophy circles, but, unfortunately, I found this book to teeter in that direction often enough to make me uncomfortable.

I confess up front that I am in no way a historian of philosophy, so my views on feminist philosophy might be unduly influenced by mainstream philosophy, which is exactly Gardner's target of critique. Not being a historian, I am in no position to assess Gardner's textural interpretations of the various authors she discusses and critiques. But, being a feminist philosopher, I am in the position to assess her views about what constitutes philosophy, feminism, and feminist philosophy, and I found these to be problematic if only because important points are sometimes muddled.

Gardner lists several different features that would make a view a feminist philosophical view. One is that while "patrimonial" philosophy searches for knowledge for its own sake, feminist philosophy has a political aim, which is to identify and eliminate the subordination of women. (2) This is the most prominent theme running through the book that is used to assess whether the work of a historical figure is really feminist. I agree that the critical feature for determining whether a view is feminist is that it aims to end women's oppression, but this feature does not make the view philosophical. For a view to be correctly labeled as philosophical would entail that it involved critical analysis, at the very least. After all, many different theories, including ones from sociology, political science, history, psychology, law, and the like, can have as their aim ending women's oppression, and thus be feminist in nature, but they are not philosophical theories, unless anything counts as philosophy. Gardner never clearly states what philosophy is, which I hoped she would do, but instead says that philosophers should be more open-minded about what counts as philosophy and not just focus on traditional views. I think her discussion wavers between traditional accounts of history of philosophy and analytic philosophy.

Another feature of feminist philosophy, according to Gardner, is the methodology employed. Whereas "patrimonial" philosophy is grounded in a "lineage" model, according to which a philosopher (usually a student) revises what an earlier philosopher (usually a teacher) has said, feminist philosophy is much more open as to the kind of methodology used that counts as philosophical work. It would include, for instance, personal notes and advice manuals. The advantage of feminist philosophy on this point is that there is less of a chance of missing the contributions of women philosophers. (10) What is more, the "lineage" model used in traditional history of philosophy employs the model of "battling philosophers," an adversarial methodology that favors aggression, as philosophers like Janice Moulton have complained, which, according to Moulton, "requires behavior that is not culturally constructed as feminine" and thus excludes women. (11) Here is one example of how I find this book to border on an essentialist or equally problematic view of male and female traits. The weaker claim that women are expected to be and so come to be passive rather than aggressive, just like the stronger claim that women are in essence passive, and men, aggressive, is fraught with familiar problems. That women are less aggressive than men, whether due to their nature or their conforming to social expectations, is not borne out by evidence, is sexist, and is harmful to women, so we are better off avoid these generalizations. In addition, philosophy need not be adversarial. Perhaps the history of philosophy can be read this way, and maybe certain areas of philosophy measure progress in terms of how one's theory improves upon that of another, but plenty of philosophy is new and creative and not simply responsive to what has gone before.

Finally, while "patrimonial" philosophy is thought to be "pure" in the sense that the traditional view of the knower, knowledge, and the way knowledge is gained is that of a disinterested, autonomous subject who is detached from the objects of knowledge and disembodied (14), feminist philosophy is "impure" in the sense that it includes the motivations and biases of persons who seek to alleviate women's oppression. Success for feminist philosophy, according to Gardner, is not measured by having an unbeatable argument, but by whether one's theory empowers women. I ask, why can't it be both? If a work is philosophical, it has to give arguments, since justification is what philosophy is all about. A philosophical work that aimed to end women's oppression would give some analysis of oppression, show how other work in the area at issue (i.e., the concepts used, the goal, the way the methodology excludes women) does not advance this goal or even impedes it, and show how a different analysis of the concepts or a new methodology or whatever takes us further to the goal of ending women's oppression. It obviously would have to rely on empirical data to establish claims about oppression.

But the philosophical aspects I just outlined will inevitably involve argumentation (e.g., argumentation about the distinction between oppression and instances of discrimination), and Gardner later suggests that the defining mark of a work in philosophy is that it be grounded in reason and argumentation. (140) It would be useful if she were to define philosophy and to hold fast to the definition throughout. On this point, I found that Gardner was not sufficiently attentive to the fact that content determines whether a work is philosophical, by which I mean that it invokes philosophizing about an issue, engaging it in a critical way. Instead of focusing on this, Gardner at points talks about the kind of work it is (e.g., an advice manual versus a traditional book or lecture). I would have liked to see more focus on the former, as it would give insight into her understanding of philosophy.

Gardner has a chapter discussing Anne Doyle Wheeler and William Thomson, Catharine Beecher, Frances Wright, and John Stuart Mill. Space allows me to treat mostly the first two. Wheeler and Thomson are utilitarians because at the heart of their work, The Appeal of One Half of the Human Race, Women, Against the Pretensions of the Other Half, Men, to Retain Them in Political, and Thence in Civil and Domestic Slavery, is the view that all persons are equal and must be given equal opportunity to experience happiness. (42) Their goal is to show that keeping women oppressed is wrong not just because of the loss of happiness to women, but because the loss of happiness men would suffer from women's liberation. (44) The problem Gardner sees is how to convince men to allow women equality, since men will not give up their power willingly. (45, 50) Wheeler and Thomson believe that having political rights allows a person to become a benevolent utilitarian. Without political rights, women cannot develop their minds and characters and thus enjoy the highest pleasures. So a community of rational persons that wants to promote the happiness of all should accord women political rights. (53) But women should not be the dominant political group, since this would be at odds with the goal of happiness for all. Surely, though, feminism doesn't defend women's being the dominant group -- it is theory that does not support any kind of domination, but equality. To achieve the goal of happiness for all, Wheeler and Thomson call on women to respect themselves so men will respect them. (57) Since women cannot appeal to men's self-interest, they must appeal to men's benevolence, calling on them to have a change of heart. I am, of course, not optimistic about this proposal, but motivating change is a complicated matter.

According to Gardner, Wheeler and Thomson want ultimately not just that women have equal rights and opportunities with men, but that women are treated with respect and dignity. Gardner reads this as their wanting empowerment for women, but I read it also as their wanting something that utilitarianism cannot really give them -- i.e., something Kantian. I am suspicious about the compatibility of utilitarianism and feminism, and I was hoping that she would have explored this issue more extensively than she does. Gardner claims in the end that Wheeler and Thomson still advocate that women stay in traditional gender roles of childbearing and rearing, so she rightly questions whether their view empowers women. Still, she believes that theirs is a work in feminist philosophy because it places women at the center of their argument, it eschews the purity of philosophy by recognizing the need to examine the empirical causes of women's oppression, and it stirs the right political emotions in the reader and does not simply appeal to the reader's intellect. This last point is another place where I find a slip to essentialism: feminist philosophy has to do with stirring emotions, not engaging intellect, and emotions have long been associated with women, intellect with men. I would rather stick with her earlier view in the chapter, that the work is feminist because it advocates women's having equal rights and opportunities and being treated with dignity and respect. Then point out that it is inconsistent in advocating traditional roles for women.

Catharine Beecher was best known as an economist, but Gardner sees her as a relational feminist. Gardner never defines what she means by relational feminism, but perhaps it is similar to the kind of feminism endorsed by the ethic of care, though, of course, the current thinking on this theory is that it is feminine, not feminist, since it valorizes traits associated with women but does not necessarily aim to end women's oppression. According to Gardner, Beecher wrote primarily in domestic advice manuals and collections of advice letters, but these venues were the ones that white, middle-class women were likely to read, not having formal intellectual training. Women played a central role in her philosophy. The goal set out for them was to educate and provide moral example, to make the world a virtuous place by populating it with virtuous children, and much of Beecher's work aims at training women for their moral and social roles. (80, 83) Beecher believed that all things were made for the purpose of producing happiness. (95) She believed that the mind was motivated by a desire for enjoyment and an avoidance of pain, and that it always sacrifices the lesser for the greater good. (95) Furthermore, she believed that God designed our duties so that they bring about pleasure for ourselves, and our sacrificing becomes a habit and a pleasure in itself. (96) Women have to sacrifice themselves by using their "feminine" skills of teaching and obeying and being moral exemplars to children. (97) They should be happiness makers in the home. No matter how lowly the task they must engage in, such as certain domestic chores, the task should be viewed as an act of benevolence. (300-301)

Gardner recognizes that the notion that women must be self-sacrificial for the good of society does not have a feminist ring to it. Yet she believes that Beecher has a feminist philosophy: women can achieve power -- particularly moral power and economic independence -- through self-subordination to the greatest social happiness. (82) Gardner believes that Beecher has an "empowerment utilitarianism." This is so for several reasons. One is that education turns out to be economically, socially, and morally good for women themselves. Second is that utilitarianism has a practical component to it, which is that women should be happiness-makers in the home. Again, this comes close to the essentialist view that women are more interested in practical matters than in intellectual ones.

Third, Gardner believes that Beecher's theory is feminist because women play a large role in it, as the focus is on their role as moral educators. The ideal woman is an economically independent, socially valued teach who combats childhood illiteracy by educating children on the virtues. (106) Men are not at the center of her theory, which makes it different from traditional philosophical theories at this time. Of course, we must caution that a theory can make women central but not in a way the aims to end their oppression. Gardner notes that women need not be subordinate on Beecher's theory because their moral task does not require that they be part of the traditional family, but they can set up alternative households and still teach children about virtue. (105) Again I would caution that if a theory truly were feminist, it would speak against women's subordinate roles, not merely allow alternative roles. Finally, Gardner notes that women's moral power is about their ability to include others in a community of minds working together to achieve the greatest happiness. (107) But since their work is done in the private sphere, Beecher ensures that women are kept out of the public sphere. (108) This, too, makes me question whether Beecher's theory is feminist, since the power of a social group lies mainly with its impact in the public sphere.

Gardner argues that Mill's utilitarianism, contrary to popular belief, was not feminist. She believes that The Subjection of Women was not about women's empowerment, but about the moral requirements for the English in their role as "civilizing" colonialists. (154) She believes that Mill was writing for an audience of male legislators and not women in need of liberation. (163) The main problems that Gardner finds with this work include that Mill does not challenge the traditional sexual division of labor, that his work is conservative overall, that he is ambiguous about the "nature" of women, and that he offers a utilitarian justification for sexual equality. I found the evidence in this chapter rather weak and not sufficiently damning of Mill's theory as a feminist one. Gardner thinks that Mill merely offers women legal and economic protections and defends them against critiques of their abilities and nature, but that this is not to aim to empower women. (178) I am not sure why this isn't empowering for women, even if she is correct about his book's intended audience.