Causation, Physics, and the Constitution of Reality: Russell's Republic Revisited

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Huw Price and Richard Corry (eds.), Causation, Physics, and the Constitution of Reality: Russell's Republic Revisited, Oxford University Press, 2007, 403pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199278190.

Reviewed by Marc Lange, University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


This is an excellent collection of papers concerning the ontological status of causal relations in light of the microworld revealed by physics. The contributors are Arif Ahmed, Helen Beebee, Richard Corry, Antony Eagle, Adam Elga, Mathias Frisch, Christopher Hitchcock, Douglas Kutach, Barry Loewer, Peter Menzies, John Norton, Huw Price, and Jim Woodward. The volume's sub-title ("Russell's Republic Revisited") alludes to Bertrand Russell's much-quoted remark comparing the "law of causality" to the monarchy as a "relic of a bygone age, surviving … only because it is erroneously supposed to do no harm."[1] Unlike Russell, all of this volume's contributors emphasize the value of causal judgments, especially in practical deliberation (which presupposes the distinction between "effective" and "ineffective" strategies for causally influencing the future).[2] The contributors disagree about whether there are causal relations throughout the microphysical world, or only in certain special parts of it, or only when certain parts are considered in isolation from the rest, or not really at all. Price and Corry situate many of the contributors as rejecting a "monarchist" metaphysical primitivism regarding causation as well as an "anarchist" Russellian eliminativism in favor of some form of "causal republicanism" according to which We, the People -- whether through our special interests, our limited powers of observation and control, or our perspectives as agents -- are partly responsible for the existence (so to say) of causal relations or, at least, for the utility of causal judgments.

Inevitably, I cannot try to summarize all of these stimulating papers or all of the fascinating issues they raise. I must be content with giving just a few of the many highlights.

Norton ("Causation as Folk Science") argues that various folk causal theories in physics (and common sense), though strictly false, are heuristically useful in certain limited applications, just as heat behaves in many respects as if it were a conserved flowing substance. Caloric and causes are in some sense real: they are not wholly fictional (like unicorns) but they do not belong to fundamental ontology. (I'll return to Norton in a moment.)

Eagle ("Pragmatic Causation") and Menzies ("Causation in Context") agree with Norton in denying that causal relations belong to fundamental ontology. Whereas Norton argues that the utility of folk causal theories (like the rough accuracy of caloric theory) can be derived by applying fundamental physics to a circumscribed range of cases, Eagle and Menzies argue that causal ascriptions fail to supervene on non-causal facts because they depend on which factors can be ignored and which behaviors count as defaults in a given conversational context. Of course, it is tempting to reply that certain factors can be ignored precisely because they are not among the causes of those things we are interested in, and likewise that a certain behavior is the default for a given system precisely because the system behaves in that way when no external causes are acting upon it. Menzies replies that it would be inadvisable to see this kind of worry as a reason to reject this model of causal reasoning because the kind of default reasoning that this model deems central to causal reasoning is also central to many of our best scientific theories (from Newtonian mechanics to population biology). "Consequently, the rejection of the kind of default causal reasoning described in this paper would necessitate the rejection of the reasoning embedded in some of our best scientific theories" (p. 222). But to reject a philosophical theory according to which causal ascriptions are made true partly by context-sensitive defaults (rather than the other way around) is not to reject default reasoning or the scientific theories that employ it.

Norton argues that

centuries of failed attempts to formulate a principle of causality, robustly true under the introduction of new scientific theories, have left the notion of causation so plastic that virtually any new science can be made to conform to it. Such a plastic notion fails to restrict possibility and is physically empty. (p. 12)

To show that "[e]ven quite simple Newtonian systems can harbor uncaused events and ones for which the theory cannot even supply probabilities" (p. 22), Norton offers a wonderfully provocative new example of indeterminism in classical mechanics: a point particle perched at the apex of a frictionless domed surface in a uniform gravitational field, where the dome is cunningly shaped so that Newton's laws are obeyed not only if the body remains at the apex forever, but also if it remains there until some arbitrary moment and then no longer. The body just takes off down the hill for no reason -- without its having even had some determinate chance of taking off at that moment.[3]

One might try to turn this example against Norton by arguing that if (as Norton says) a body acting under the influence of such a force in classical physics cannot be interpreted in causal terms, then a "principle of causality" does indeed "place a restriction on the factual content of a science" (p. 15) since it rules out such a force, given the classical dynamical laws. Therefore, a principle of causality must not be as empty as Norton claims. Norton might reply that such a restriction would be "a kind of a priori science that tries to legislate in advance how the world must be" (p. 15). But why should such a principle of causality, limiting the range of possible force functions, be any more a priori than the rest of classical physics?[4]

Woodward ("Causation with a Human Face") and Hitchcock ("What Russell Got Right") note that on an interventionist or manipulationist account, some of the ordinary presuppositions for the application of causal notions are not satisfied by the universe taken globally, to which the notion of an intervention from outside is inapplicable. Folk causal models of the kind described by Norton best fit subsystems that can be treated for our purposes as isolated from a great deal of their surroundings. Elga ("Isolation and Folk Physics") aims to identify the features of the fundamental natural laws that make so many ordinary subsystems amenable to such treatment. Roughly speaking, the behaviors of distant things make only small differences to the medium-sized objects that we tend to care about, and those small differences are unlikely to pull in a consistent direction (given the fundamental probability distribution over the possible microrealizers of the universe's initial low-entropy macrostate) and so are unlikely to affect the rough macroscopic behaviors of those objects. Thus, a folk model can succeed by characterizing a subsystem's default behavior and how it can be disturbed by interactions with only a few other subsystems. Folk causal models can even encompass systems that are sensitive to small differences (and hence to many distant factors) by including objective chances, which themselves are insensitive to such small differences.

Notice, though, that in giving this account, Elga uses causal notions. For instance, the fundamental probability distribution over the universe's possible initial conditions "counts it as unlikely that small differences in forces would affect the rough behavior of" a given macroscopic object (p. 110). I wonder: Does that use of causal vocabulary also fall under the account being given?

Price ("Causal Perspectivalism") understands being a cause as neither like containing some quantity of caloric nor like containing some non-zero number of unicorns, but rather as like being a foreigner or being at rest: a property possessed only from a given perspective. Price argues that if the temporal asymmetry of causation is fixed by some primitive metaphysical fact, rather than by facts about us or our environment, then the reason why it plays such an important role in our practical deliberations remains mysterious. Russell was right that the asymmetry is not built into the fundamental laws of physics. If it is fixed by some environmental asymmetry (such as the thermodynamic asymmetry: that entropy typically increases toward the future), then when considering a possible world where that asymmetry is reversed (or absent), the direction of causation should be reversed (or causal relations should be absent). But that is not the case, Price argues. When we causally characterize a possible world or hypothetical spacetime region where the actual fundamental laws of nature hold but entropy typically decreases toward the future (or has no typical trend), we ascribe the usual kinds of causal relations. We do not exchange causes and effects. Price concludes that the temporal asymmetry of causal relations is fixed not by the environment of the events standing in those relations, but rather by the environment of the ascriber of those relations.

Price sees the perspective taken in practical deliberation as essentially involving a distinction between what is settled and what is open. (Our practical deliberations concern one open feature: our course of action.) Because of the prevailing thermodynamic asymmetry, we typically find the past rather than the future epistemically accessible and so take the past as fixed. Since the deliberative perspective treats the future differently from the past not by stipulation, but only in view of accidental environmental circumstances, the deliberative perspective can account for the asymmetry of causation. Price suggests that deliberators where the thermodynamic arrow is reversed would correctly (from their perspective) regard the future as typically causing the past (since they would be taking their cues from the prevailing thermodynamic asymmetry) and so would deliberate regarding the past. This strikes me as akin to suggesting (with Mach) that the water's surface in Newton's bucket would be curved if the universe were made to revolve around it.

That causal relations exist from our perspective because we deliberate leaves it mysterious (I think) why we deliberate at all. The alternative is that we deliberate as we do because we want to affect the future. On this view, we fail to deliberate in the same way regarding the past not fundamentally because we already know all about the past (at least "in principle"), but rather because we know that there would be no point in deliberating about the past (except in time-travel scenarios and so forth) since we cannot causally influence it. Of course, causal relations would then have to exist independent of our deliberative standpoint, raising Price's worry that once we characterize causation metaphysically, it will be unclear why we care about "affecting" the future. But this worry must compete with (what seems to me) Price's inability to explain why we take the deliberative standpoint in the first place.

Causal asymmetry is significant not only in practical deliberation, but also in an important variety of scientific explanation. If causal relations are tied to the deliberative standpoint, then they are not essential to science if the deliberative standpoint is not. Perhaps, if causal relations are creatures of some perspective, then an "explanatory perspective" would more easily capture their scientific significance.

How is the thermodynamic asymmetry responsible for the typical difference in epistemic accessibility between the past and the future? Loewer ("Counterfactuals and the Second Law") presents an explanation that ultimately grounds the causal asymmetry not in our deliberative perspective, but (contrary to Russell) in asymmetries of natural law, which yield asymmetries in counterfactual dependence. Given that the universe long ago had an extremely low-entropy macrostate (the "past hypothesis", in David Albert's suggestive terminology[5]) and given the canonical probability distribution over this macrostate's possible microrealizations (both of which, Loewer says, qualify as laws on David Lewis's "best-system" account and so function as laws in counterfactual reasoning), the deep past is constrained in ways that the far future is not. Accordingly, current "traces" constrain and so allow us to know the relatively recent past, unlike the relatively near future. Although there are possible microrealizations of today's foot-shaped depression in the sand that, traced back in time according to microdynamical law, derive from a conspiracy of unrelated "random" events rather than a human foot, the past hypothesis and microcanonical initial probability distribution make these microrealizations very unlikely. On this picture, unlike the interventionist account, causal notions are applicable even to the universe taken globally.

Frisch ("Causation, Counterfactuals, and Entropy") replies that our ordinary inferences from current "traces" to the relatively recent past do not appeal to the past hypothesis: "most people are not at all in a position to assume what that initial condition might be" (p. 370). Indeed, Frisch might have added, for our knowledge of the past to presuppose the past hypothesis would be for our historical knowledge (whether based on memory or on other records) to depend implausibly on a relatively recent discovery of physics. Of course, the past hypothesis might nevertheless be partly responsible for the rough accuracy of the folk causal theories on which our knowledge of the past depends (though Frisch incisively questions whether it is sufficient for the reliability of records and for the past's counterfactual independence from the present). But knowledge, at least in an internalist sense, requires more than just a belief produced by a reliable mechanism. When we infer from today's foot-shaped depression in the sand to a human foot's having imprinted it, Frisch argues, our presumption that there were probably no prior "random" sandy events conspiring to produce a foot-shaped depression is based not on any knowledge of the universe's initial condition, but rather on our past observations of sandy beaches.

Whether causal relations are of, by, and for the people, or whether the laws of nature and of nature's God entitle certain events "causes" and others "effects", will continue to be debated. This volume is an excellent place to join that debate.

[1] "On the Notion of Cause", Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 13 (1913): 1-26, p. 1.

[2] The contributors are inspired almost as much by Nancy Cartwright's classic "Causal Laws and Effective Strategies" (Nous 13 (1979): 419-38) as they are by Russell.

[3] There are other examples of force functions to which classical physics offers multiple solutions, assigning no particular objective chances to any of them. See, for instance, Keith Hutchison, "Is Classical Mechanics Really Time-Reversible and Deterministic?", British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 44 (1993): 307-23. Norton's example has already received considerable attention. See, for example, David Malament, "Norton's Slippery Slope", PSA 2006, forthcoming.

[4] For more on the possible status of such principles, see my "Must the Fundamental Laws of Physics Be Complete?", Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, forthcoming.

[5] Time and Chance, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2000.