Centering and Extending: An Essay on Metaphysical Sense

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Stephen G. Smith, Centering and Extending: An Essay on Metaphysical Sense, SUNY Press, 2017, 222pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438464237.

Reviewed by Keith Robinson, University of Arkansas at Little Rock


The 'end of metaphysics' scenarios that characterized a good deal of twentieth century philosophy have given way to a broad range of contemporary metaphysical options. From metametaphysics and formal approaches to naturalized metaphysics and various kinds of metaphysical realisms (mainstream, speculative, modal, process, etc.), idealisms and pragmatisms, metaphysics in analytic and non-analytic fields is flourishing. What is metaphysics, what value does it have, what are its objects or entities, what are its scope and limits and how should it proceed are, despite the Kantian settlement, all still live questions. In Stephen G. Smith's new book, these questions are approached, but Smith wants to 'do' metaphysics; that is, propose and construct a system of his own by leaning on the great traditions of Western philosophy. For Smith, the metaphysical menu currently on offer has various limitations and drawbacks (I'll come back to this point) and the remnants of the end of metaphysics programs have developed into post-metaphysical philosophies that, in the absence of "metaphysical grip" (5), bring distortions of their own. Whether we like it or not, metaphysics returns and, if not actively acknowledged and carefully reflected upon, inevitably makes trouble for our efforts to make sense of the world. Readers engaged with the history of Western metaphysics, the contemporary revival of metaphysics in continental philosophy, or in current metaphysics of mind should find something of interest in this book.

Smith's book has three sections. The first is a historical preparation where the author gleans what he needs from the Western traditions of philosophy. The second (chapter 4) lays out the key metaphysical ideas, and the final section tests these ideas in relation to problems in philosophy of mind and cosmology.

One central problem in metaphysical sense-making for Smith is the relations between thought and things, a basic given of our experience. The various projects of physicalism, dualism and monism run aground in accounting for these aspects of being by overextending their chosen principles whilst leaving out some important aspect of the experienced relation between thought and thing. There need to be constraints and limits on the jurisdictions of metaphysics, but rather than the Kantian epistemological criterion that distinguishes things as they appear and things in themselves, Smith wants to distinguish between meaningfulness and sense as a means to limn the structure of the world. This is a distinction between "beings as appeal-making, trial-bearing partners in meaningful encounter and beings in their intellectually comprehensible, sense-bearing being" (5). For Smith, sense is a minimal condition for orientation and direction in the world, and meaningfulness is a response to those beings that claim our attention when that sufficient condition has been met.

Some, of course, have wished to deny that metaphysical propositions have any sense or substantial referent at all, and Smith does consider the possibility of aligning metaphysical sense with a movement that doesn't rely on empirical determinations or the testability of 'thing-reference'. But this anti-reifying move appears to be at the cost of meaningfulness "since the normal scenario of meaningfulness is to be in the presence of an appealing Something" (13). Smith notes that metaphysics is tied to things in another respect: pure relationalism seems to lead to an infinite regress, and there being things to be related looks like "one of the most basic requirements of sense-making" (14). Smith states in his preface that his view is "process-oriented" (vii), and throughout he claims to rely upon a "process premise" (4). This raises several questions early on: what precisely in this book is the process premise, and what does the reliance upon it amount to? Numerous versions of the process premise challenge the idea that things are the most basic requirement of sense without it being at the expense of meaningfulness (construed pragmatically). Nietzsche comes immediately to mind, as do a long list of other thinkers, including Bergson, who plays an important role in this book, and to whom I'll return. Smith cites the oft-repeated claim that pure relationalism leads to infinite regress, but this is all too Eleatic or Parmenidean in that it imposes a priori principles upon the possibilities of sense-making.

Smith's understanding of metaphysical distortions and his distinction between sense and meaningfulness raises the question of anthropocentrism and whether his efforts at metaphysical sense-making are governed by concerns that, in the end, are 'human, all too human'. Metaphysical danger lurks for Smith in identifying an "extraordinary appellant" (18) that will provide a direction for sense and an ultimate guide for meaning. For Smith, one guards against this by, on the one hand, developing a critique of abstractions which provides leverage on common sense but also runs the risk of estranging it; or, on the other hand, proceeding on the basis of our most fundamental assumptions which reflect "our living placement in an actual world stocked with medium-sized objects and stalked by fellow intenders" (19). Although Smith doesn't use the phrase, this sounds something like a metaphysical version of 'reflective equilibrium' in which one works back and forth between these approaches, seeking a general accommodation between them. One concern here is that anthropocentric 'defaults' are built in on both sides of the equilibrium, with 'common sense', 'medium sized objects' and 'fellow intenders' providing the grounding poles. Metaphysical experimentation within the confines of these approaches already sharply delimits and restricts what counts as distortive along human-centered lines. Smith is clearly attracted to the idea of an open-mindedness about how anything obtains, or can be an 'appellant,' to use his term, yet sense remains conjoined to human-centered meaning. Rather than metaphysics as a critique of and challenge to the privileged centering of the human which we find in various late modern thinkers -- for example, Deleuze and Whitehead, who are both discussed in this book -- it appears that a certain conception of metaphysics for 'us', and a conception of meaningfulness for the human, remains as the centering desideratum or extraordinary appellant guiding and directing the metaphysical tasks in this book.

Perhaps it is not surprising that Smith finds that Parmenidean being provides an excellent introduction to metaphysical sense. However, he is not relying upon a standard doctrine that has Parmenides as the purveyor of being as an entity understood as a pure substance or a 'thing in itself', a pure presence that is ungenerated, imperishable, whole, one, indivisible, eternal, motionless and continuous. Rather, Smith wants to draw out the sense of estin as a pure positivity, an 'it is' as the basic orientation for thinking. If this is a pure and bare surface of what is, then how might one proceed to construct a scheme that will both be metaphysically corrective and elucidate thoughts and things? Chapters 2 and 3 draw out a narrative of the advantages and disadvantages of the Platonist and Cartesian traditions to address this question. In brief, Smith surveys ideas of form, soul, matter and mind in Plato, Aristotle and Plotinus for the Platonic tradition and Descartes, Spinoza and Leibniz for the Cartesian. Smith's readings of these thinkers are often interesting, insightful and engaged with the original texts, showing how each offers something to move the scheme forward while falling short of the required balance or interdependency between thoughts and things. Intriguingly, it is Bergson who comes along to play the hero in this historical narrative, at least in terms of the Cartesian tradition. What Smith is looking for, and what he gets from Bergson, sounds very much like the relational ontology that had been dispatched earlier as leading to infinite regress. Avoiding both disjunctive dualism and reductive monism, Bergson posits the image, halfway between the thing and the representation. But rather than describing the image as a basic kind of existent, Smith describes it as a device for "uncovering the partnership of intensity and extensity" (80), where intensity is not to be conceived as a psychic force or atomic element of sensation, and extensity is not the spatialized stuff of Cartesian geometry. The image is both intensive and extensive, where each is, or can be, the inversion of the other. Bergson gives us a way to think of (extensive) matter and (intensive) memory as relational expressions of each other that constitute reality.

One possible concern relating to the historical chapters is that Smith is pursuing a metaphysical eclecticism, picking and choosing ideas like an intellectual magpie, without fully engaging the systems from which they come. In some cases, this would challenge his selections and how they're deployed in his scheme. For example, Deleuze and Guattari are praised for having "carried out one of the most thorough fundamental corrections of classical metaphysics" (107) but in the end their metaphysics "tilts towards materialism" (108). This might be the case, but then just how do key notions like the 'virtual' or the 'event' or the time of 'Aion,' which is said to be "independent of all matter", function in their work? Or, take Whitehead. Smith claims that the "most dangerous aspect of Whitehead's process metaphysics is that it plumps for an ultimate actuality in an idealist way" (105). Yet, one could argue that ultimate actuality in Whitehead needs both concrescence and transition, where transition is a fluent efficient causation. Creativity, as the ultimate actuality, expresses both these aspects without reducing to an ideal self-creating spontaneity or a monism of some underlying neutral 'stuff'. This would place Whitehead much closer to what Smith gets from Bergson. In other words, a fuller engagement with some of the key figures, especially those ostensibly closer to Smith's position, may problematize the sorting operations that allow those figures to be placed in this or that camp (idealism, materialism, etc.), enabling the argument to proceed. However, we could add that Smith is, perhaps rightly, more concerned with melding ideas into his own system rather than fully justifying his readings of the thinkers he's engaging.

The central chapter is chapter 4, which introduces and argues for the key concepts of the book's title. Here Smith converts the components derived from the Platonic and Cartesian traditions into his own notions of centering and extending. The basic thrust of the chapter, in which we are treated to 32 propositions and scholia in the manner of Spinoza, is to argue for the necessity of both centering and extending as fundamentally inseparable yet distinct characteristics of reality whereby thoughts and things are expressed through mutual reciprocity, dependence and correlation. Centering captures the necessity of form, sameness or unity, and extending captures the necessity of difference, multiplicity and plurality. For Smith, neither need require or defer to an ultimate centerer or extender (92). One question here is about the status and role of centering as a form-giving function, and whether it restores metaphysics to an ultimate centering dependent upon human determinations of meaning rather than going 'beyond the human condition', as Bergson puts it. For Smith, if the centering role is given a secondary or non-primary function, this tips the system toward the physical, but only if one remains within a hylomorphic and anthropocentric scheme. This issue is brought to the fore in Smith's ambivalence toward Deleuze and Guattari. He admires Deleuze and Guattari's double articulation of territorializing and deterritorializing processes as the basis for sense-making, but finds a "profound pointlessness" (108) in their privileging of the 'Outside' over subjectivity. If consciousness and subjectivity are just another set of intensities that happen in the great alluvial articulations of the Earth's becoming, then thinking is just "passing fun" (108). Smith is aware that Deleuze and Guattari are, like other 'postmoderns', "in revolt against appeals to presence" (108). One key reason is that presence as the self-same has worked to privilege the centering of the human at the expense of all the others, all the supposed less than human others. Deleuze and Guattari's heightened suspicion around centerings, via a thought of the Outside, is an alertness to the exclusions and violence that can accompany them and an experiment with non-human becomings and ways to stop being 'human, all too human'. Perhaps the task now, to paraphrase Jean- Francois Lyotard, is to make metaphysics inhuman.

In the final chapters, Smith takes the centering and extending perspective and uses it as a corrective in philosophy of mind and cosmology. In the age of the 'anthropocene' perhaps a more testing problem set might be climate change, which is nourished by various metaphysical dualisms and grounded upon the 'bifurcation of nature', to use Whitehead's phrase. In any case in these chapters Smith wants to show how his scheme can act as a corrective to various contemporary definitions and uses of naturalism, intentionality, consciousness, mental causation and reasons for action. In addition, Smith gives a centering and extending description of levels of being and of eternity that links back to the opening chapters and aims to account for how ultimate sense relates to the ultimacy of meaning.

Although I had questions, critical remarks and disagreements with this book, it is clear that it offers creative philosophizing in a distinctive and original voice, with much of interest that I could not include in this review. The original style and voice is coupled with an impressive grasp of a wide range of texts in the history of Western philosophy and the ability to draw out new aspects from them. Smith is, for the most part, refreshingly indifferent to 'analytic' and 'continental' distinctions, preferring to simply go where he can find what he needs and what is of metaphysical import. The boldness of some of Smith's claims, for example, the claim to solve the mind-body problem or to show "what naturalism should look like" (viii), will no doubt irritate some; for this reader, they were a lure to keep reading. Indeed, the effort to just make a case for his own metaphysical system was instructive and rewarding to follow. This is a rich, learned and complex book deserving of careful study and close reading. Overall, I would recommend it for its unique and provocative take on making metaphysical sense of the world.